Overcriminalization: The Limits of the Criminal Law

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Douglas Husak, Overcriminalization: The Limits of the Criminal Law, Oxford University Press, 2008, 231pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195328714.

Reviewed by John Gardner, University College, Oxford


Douglas Husak argues that these days, at least in the United States, there is too much criminal law. By this he means both that there are too many distinct criminal prohibitions, and that between them they cover too wide a range of human actions. It is important to see both dimensions of the problem. Legislators could reduce the sheer number of criminal prohibitions without reducing their net coverage by making each prohibition more sweeping. As Husak explains, this is not a promising way forward. The rule of law is threatened no less by the sweepingness of criminal laws than by their proliferation.

How is the rule of law threatened? In many ways. Husak catalogues some of them in his masterful first chapter, which would also serve as an excellent freestanding essay on the subject. When there is so much criminal law it is unreasonable to expect ordinary people to know what it says, so the law is prone to ambush them (11). Money and time diverted into enforcement depletes what is available to tackle the social problems that create the incentives and opportunities for offending (12). As people encounter more and more petty and obscure criminal laws, their respect for the legal system probably declines, so that the role of law in maintaining social order is threatened (12). The criminal law is forced to borrow categories from other areas of law, such as property law, which are even more complex and hard for ordinary people to grasp (13). The availability of handy fallback charges enables prosecutors to manipulate accused people into waiving their right to full trial (by 'plea-bargaining'), and hence to avoid public presentation of the case and public scrutiny of the law (22). Finally, and perhaps most strikingly, the expansion of the criminal law means that ordinary folk who regard themselves as law-abiding are now committing crimes (or arguable crimes) on an increasingly regular basis, and only official discretion (in arrest or prosecution or sentencing) is protecting them from the corresponding trials, convictions, and punishments (24). Husak rightly reserves particular opprobrium for this recent growth (or regrowth) in the discretion of petty officials, who are able to make use of increasingly vague and recondite criminal laws to intimidate people whom they are secretly selecting for attention on other grounds, often because they are part of an unfashionable or unconventional minority. As Husak says, 'the consequences of this erosion in the rule of law are monumental' (28).

This, then, is Husak's compelling diagnosis of the problem. What remedy does he prescribe? In moral philosophy, one might think, the prescription is entailed by the diagnosis. Once one knows which norms are being violated, the way forward is to end the violation of those same norms. If the problem is the criminal law's violation of the norms of the rule of law, then the solution is to bring the criminal law back into conformity with the norms of the rule of law. But this is not how Husak proceeds. Instead, in two breathtakingly good core chapters, he proposes and defends various other norms, not themselves norms of the rule of law, to serve as moral limits on criminalization. I think the logic of his position is this. Contemporary American criminal law's nonconformity with the rule of law, which everyone can recognize as a serious problem, is a consequence of contemporary American legislators' nonconformity with certain other norms, the importance of which is not adequately appreciated by legislators (or indeed by most other people). Husak makes it his job to explain and defend those other norms. His is an '[a]ttempt to combat the problem of overcriminalization by developing a set of principles to confine the criminal sanction' (91). Some of these principles (discussed in chapter two) he bills as 'internal' to the criminal law, in the sense that the law already reveals a commitment to them and cannot defend itself without invoking them. Others (discussed in chapter three) he regards as 'external' to the criminal law, in the sense that they call for an independent defence, a defence that Husak amply provides.

Husak's 'internal' principles of criminalization are fourfold. There is the nontrivial harm or evil constraint, the wrongfulness constraint, the desert constraint, and the presumption against criminalization (which Husak distractingly calls the 'burden of proof constraint'). I agree with Husak that the first three (but not the fourth) of these principles exist and that they are immanent in the criminal law. At the same time I doubt whether they have the purchase, jointly or severally, that Husak believes them to have. In other words, I doubt whether conforming to any or all of them would do much to cramp the style of overzealous legislators. Let me comment on each in turn. But let my critical comments not overshadow the countless important insights to be found in Husak's explanation and defence of the four principles.

Husak's nontrivial harm or evil constraint is offered as a constraint on legislative purpose. 'Criminal liability may not be imposed unless statutes are designed to prohibit a nontrivial harm or evil' (66, emphasis added). As Husak says, one cannot make sense of criminal laws unless one takes them to have had such a purpose. Yet as a mere constraint on purpose, the constraint is rather feeble. All criminal laws are passed in response to what their proposers believe to be a nontrivial harm or evil. And all proposers intend that their law will do something to eradicate the harm or evil in question. The important question is not whether they have this intention but whether they fulfill it. Most often, it seems to me, this is where criminal legislation falls down. Not usually because there is no nontrivial harm or evil where legislators see one, but because their fancy new law often does nothing to contain it. Far too little work is done by legislators in ensuring that their laws are not counterproductive. Like many members of the public, legislators often assume that criminalizing an activity tends to reduce its incidence, or at least tends to eradicate its worst excesses. They ignore the reality that banning an activity often drives it underground where it become more profitable (and hence more attractive to appalling people) as well as harder to supervise (and hence more appalling).

Husak criticizes those, including me, who have defended a wide version of J.S. Mill's 'harm principle' in which it is the harm prevented by the law, rather than the harm done by the criminal offence, that matters in determining whether the principle was satisfied (72). But in at least two ways this wide harm principle is stricter than Husak's own nontrivial harm or evil constraint. In the first place, it requires a harm, not merely an evil. Lying or cheating is an evil but it need not be harmful. Secondly, and more importantly, the harm principle regulates achievement as well as endeavour. The law must actually prevent the harm that it is intended to prevent, and must, moreover, do so in a way that is proportionate to the harm actually prevented. Herein lies the real power of the harm principle as a constraint on legislators. It is easy to point to a harm that one's pet legislation is designed to eradicate; it is a lot harder to show that it eradicates it. Unfortunately this powerful constraint is not immanent in the criminal law. It calls for independent defence. All that is immanent in the criminal law is the weaker constraint identified by Husak as the nontrivial harm of evil constraint, and this gives legislators nothing to lose sleep over. Husak seems to acknowledge this when he writes that he 'will place surprisingly little weight on this first internal constraint', even though it could be beefed up by further argument so as to 'have enormous potential to retard the growth of the criminal law' (72).

Yet overzealous legislators have, it seems to me, even less to fear from Husak's second constraint, the wrongdoing constraint, according to which '[c]riminal liability may not be imposed unless the defendant's conduct is (in some sense) wrongful' (66). All crimes are legal wrongs and all legal wrongs are purported moral wrongs, i.e. they are moral wrongs according to the law. All that it takes to turn them into true moral wrongs is that the law in question is morally acceptable. It follows without further ado that the wrongdoing constraint is no constraint. The wrongdoing constraint cannot enter into a determination of whether the law in question is morally acceptable since the question of whether the constraint is satisfied depends on an independent assessment of whether the law in question is morally acceptable. Of course one could insist on a stronger wrongdoing constraint that would have real bite. One could insist that all crimes must already be wrongs quite apart from the law. All crimes must be mala in se; no mala prohibita are allowed. But this constraint would also need an independent defence. It is not immanent in the law. Besides, Husak rightly allows for there to be mala prohibita in the criminal law. Inasmuch as he limits the range of mala prohibita, he seems to rely on his third constraint, the desert constraint, to do so. The reasons for the prohibition of the malum prohibitum must also 'justify state impositions of hard treatment and stigma', i.e. state punishment (119). With the buck passed thus to the desert constraint, the wrongdoing constraint seems to have no work of its own left to do.

Unfortunately, however, the desert constraint meets a similar fate. According to this constraint, '[p]unishment is justified only when and to the extent that it is deserved' with the result that 'some (real or imaginary) criminal laws should be placed beyond the reach of the punitive sanction' (82). And to put criminal laws beyond the reach of the punitive sanction is to decriminalize them (77). Husak is right that this constraint, for what it's worth, is immanent in the criminal law. It is a presupposition of each criminal law that at least some of those who break that law deserve to be punished. But what is the constraint worth? Husak tries to show its importance by exposing as implausible a view known as 'legalistic retributivism' (associated with J.D. Mabbott) which reduces the importance of the constraint to zero by holding that punishment of a law-breaker is deserved simply on the ground of his or her law-breaking. This is implausible, observes Husak, precisely because it 'allows punishment whatever the criminal law happens to proscribe' (89). But this answer to Mabbott does not show, as Husak hopes, that the desert constraint is a constraint on criminalization. In fact it strongly suggests the opposite. It strongly suggests that a criminal law must be a justified one before it is appropriate to punish for its breach. This being so, the justification of the punishment depends on the justification of the criminal law for breach of which one is punished, not vice versa. Each criminal law still needs a justification independent of the desert constraint before the desert constraint can be applied. So the justification of a criminal law cannot depend on whether it satisfies the desert constraint.

How about the presumption against criminalization? This Husak bases on the thought that punishment infringes rights, and that 'the burden of proof in justifying the infringement of rights is generally placed on those who would potentially violate them' (100). Here Husak invokes a well-known distinction, which I agree is important, between the infringement of rights (justified) and the violation of rights (unjustified). Personally I doubt whether people who deserve punishment (i.e. those whose criminalization satisfies the desert constraint) have a right not to be punished, and hence a right that is infringed by their punishment. I think it more likely that there exists a right not to be punished, and hence a right that is infringed by punishment, only in the much rarer case of those who are justifiably punished even though they do not deserve it (a case also discussed by Husak, 100-1). But be that as it may, the existence of such a right is not presupposed in the criminal law. And even if it were it would do nothing to support the existence of any presumption against criminalization. Whether criminalization is justified depends on what reasons there are, and what reasons are acted on, not on what reasons are given or presented. A legal system that does not prohibit murder or rape (where prohibiting it would help to prevent it) cannot shield itself from legitimate public criticism by saying that its critics are the ones who have to make the case for such prohibitions. Of course it is true, as Husak says, that legislators have a duty to explain why they want to criminalize what they want to criminalize. But this is because they are legislators, not because they are in favour of criminalization. Their duty is an aspect of the general doctrine of open government, according to which public officials must justify their actions publicly and thereby subject their work to public scrutiny. This doctrine is not specific to the enactment of criminal laws and unlike a presumption it does not let anyone off the hook when they do nothing because they cannot be bothered to make a good argument for doing something.

Husak says that the internal constraints he identifies 'may not appear to be radical' (122). I have suggested that, on this score, appearances are not deceptive. Inasmuch as they are immanent in the criminal law, Husak's four constraints are vanishingly weak; inasmuch as they can grow proper teeth, they can do so only when armed with an independent defence that does not rely on the criminal law's existing commitments.

So our attention moves on to what Husak calls 'external constraints': to showing that today's legislators are overstepping the mark whatever the criminal law itself may have to say on the subject. Husak advocates and defends three such external constraints: the substantial state interest constraint, the direct advancement constraint, and the minimum necessary extent constraint. (He also devises special versions of these constraints to apply to crimes of risk prevention, which I will not discuss here.) These three constraints are connected in such a way that we might, as Husak sometimes does, prefer to talk of there being one external constraint with three limbs or 'prongs' (154). To be exact, the substantial state interest (mentioned in the first constraint) is the interest that must be directly advanced (according to the second constraint) and relative to which the minimum necessary extent of the law must be judged (according to the third constraint). Here Husak is inspired by a method of judicial control of legislation familiar from American constitutional law, known as 'intermediate scrutiny'. He argues that criminal laws, because they are punitive laws, should always meet (at least) the intermediate scrutiny requirements, rather than the lower ('rational basis') level of scrutiny to which the Supreme Court often currently subjects them. 'As the right not to be punished is valuable, no law that implicates it is justified simply because it has a rational basis. A higher standard of justification should be applied throughout the criminal arena' (125).

It is in this part of his discussion -- a tour de force that should be studied by constitutional lawyers as well as criminal lawyers -- that Husak begins to attend to the problem of counterproductive laws, the prime candidates being anti-drugs laws. Many anti-drugs laws, and many other laws like them, seem to fall at the hurdle of Husak's second external constraint, the direct advancement constraint, which 'requires a determination of whether the … legislative purpose will actually be served' (145). They seem to fall but do they fall? It is difficult to be sure because of the way in which the second external constraint is harnessed by Husak to the first, the substantial state interest constraint. Husak seems to allow that there may be a substantial state interest in 'express[ing] the moral disapproval of the state' (150), such that criminal laws may pass muster under the first constraint even if their objective is 'expressive rather than preventive' (149). Although he says various skeptical things about this objective -- for example, he wonders whether anti-drugs laws really do convey a message that cannot be conveyed without them -- he does not seem to be prepared to rule out such mere moral message-conveying as an objective of the state that serves a substantial state interest. I, on the other hand, would rule it out entirely under the heading of the harm principle. The conveying of messages must also serve to prevent harm, and proportionately so, before the criminal law (or, I would like to add, before any law) can be enrolled to do the conveying.

The harm principle is a principle of toleration. The view with which it is most flatly incompatible is the view held by many who like the law to send a strong moral message, a view according to which whatever the state does not prohibit by criminal law, it thereby condones. This view, discussed at some length by Husak (149-151), leaves no logical space for the state to tolerate anything. Given that the view has such a freaky implication, Husak is remarkably kind to it.

More generally, Husak is an open-minded and generous critic who offers his external constraints on criminalization in a spirit of constructive dialogue. He prefers where possible to rely on ecumenical premises and to keep the debate away from its most contentious details. His more detailed attention to the so-called internal constraints on criminalization is another symptom of this same ecumenicalism. Like many philosophers of law, especially in the highly charged political atmosphere of the United States, he prefers to hold the law to moral standards that are already legally accepted, or can be presented as such, rather than just showing the law to be morally deficient tout court. Here he wants to find common ground with those less liberal-minded types who are predisposed to be his opponents. In the same vein, his final (fourth) chapter is given over to brief critical assessments of certain simplistic ideologies that figure prominently in public and legislative debate over criminalization, and that rival his own approach. Husak's responses are uniformly gentle, thoughtful and charitable. His greatest interest, it seems, is in raising the level and quality of debate about legislation, especially among legislators themselves, rather than in forcing any particular conclusions about any particular criminal laws or legislative purposes.

If legislators, journalists, lobbyists and other public figures were to take even one leaf out of Husak's terrific book, the level and quality of debate about criminal legislation, and more generally about the criminal justice system, would be improved beyond all recognition. Husak's unusual combination of policy nous, philosophical rigour, and total sanity, would be a great antidote to the frenzied initiativitis, and the cynical pandering to public fear and loathing, that afflict many politicians and pundits in the United Kingdom as well as in the United States today.

But are the politicians and pundits going to swallow their medicine? Husak wonders (58ff) why so few of us who work in the philosophy of criminal law -- and there are many of us right now -- are grappling with the problem of overcriminalization, or more generally with the principles of criminalization applicable to legislators. Why do we prefer to work on other, less politically pressing topics? As he says, there are many reasons. Personally I fall into the camp identified by Andrew Ashworth in the title of his article 'Is the Criminal Law a Lost Cause?', Law Quarterly Review 116 (2000), 225. Not that I no longer see issues of philosophical interest or importance in the criminal law, but that I no longer imagine that any serious work I could do on the subject would have the slightest effect on the assorted knaves and fools who largely determine the shape of the criminal law in my country. Trying to stem the tide of fatuous law that emanates from our incontinent legislatures, at least in the US and the UK, is a luckless and thankless task. I admire Husak enormously for his willingness to take the task on, and for the lively, sensible, and good-natured tone that he brings to it. I also admire his anti-authoritarian and anti-managerial moral instincts, sadly at odds with the spirit of the age. But most of all I admire Husak as a professional philosopher of law. His work is clear, thorough, patient, ingenious, insightful, informed, imaginative, and highly distinctive. Overcriminalization is no exception. Even those who are pessimistic about the possibility of deliberately effecting political change through academic work have a huge amount to learn from this wise, timely, and well-written book.