Poverty, Agency, and Human Rights

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Diana Tietjens Meyers (ed.), Poverty, Agency, and Human Rights, Oxford University Press, 2014, 360pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199975884.

Reviewed by Jiewuh Song, Seoul National University


That the human rights movement may, despite the good intentions of its participants, propagate a "damning metaphor" of the human rights "victim figure" as a "powerless, helpless innocent"[1] is a familiar worry among practitioners. The worry seems not to have gained much traction in the philosophical literature on human rights, which has so far focused, broadly, on either theoretical puzzles generated by the idea of a universal set of rights for "all peoples and all nations"[2] or the structure and content of the human rights duties of the globally affluent. Poverty, Agency, and Human Rights is an unusual -- and welcome -- collection of philosophical essays that takes the empowerment of the globally disadvantaged to be normatively central in human rights advocacy.[3]

The shift in focus yields interesting theoretical insights. Serene Khader, for example, argues that gains in women's economic opportunities through microcredit schemes do not reliably lead to women's empowerment and, indeed, may be incompatible with advancing gender equality: these schemes can be set up so that accessing economic opportunities depends on complying with patriarchal relations. Amy Allen's broader study of the right to development is correspondingly more encompassing in its critique. Drawing on literature from a diverse range of disciplines, Allen argues that development programs have in fact made things worse for the globally impoverished and, in particular, contributed to their disempowerment, having developed into a set of economic institutions in which "the poor are effectively rendered voiceless" (254).

Allen suspects that some part of the failure has to do with a kind of mindless theoretical conservatism. The paradigm of development, Allen argues, presupposes colonial ideals of historical progress and social evolution that encourage a pernicious understanding of beneficiaries as backwards and under-developed. David Ingram makes a distinct but consonant point about the social science of poverty research. The methodological bent toward "quantitative rigor," Ingram argues, has the effect of obscuring background institutional factors that are not readily quantifiable but together coerce individuals into sub-optimizing behavior (48). Research that abstracts from these background factors promotes an understanding of poverty on which "families and individuals end up playing the decisive roles" (49).

The contributors put forth diverse accounts of the specific mechanisms through which poverty results in disempowerment, and whether and how the framework of human rights can help with the problem. Khader argues that increasing what she calls "feminist agency," or women's ability to challenge sexist norms, needs to be an independent objective of anti-poverty interventions. The problem with existing interventions, on Khader's view, is that they assume that gender equality would be a natural outgrowth of women's economic gains. Alison Jaggar, who is similarly concerned with women's empowerment, builds on previous work on "transnational cycles of gendered vulnerability that place women in systematically weak bargaining situations" to criticize the World Bank's focus on national responses in its recent World Development Report (178 and passim). For instance, Jaggar argues, the gender impacts of the global migrant worker market cannot adequately be addressed without tackling transnational factors like global economic inequality and the global prevalence of certain gendered norms and structures, e.g., on domestic responsibilities.

This push to look to broader dynamics is a recurrent theme. In addition to Ingram's methodological point, we see throughout the volume calls to understand poverty and related global problems as part of what Gillian Brock calls "systemic injustice" (141). Thus Elizabeth Ashford argues, for example, that it is a mistake to confine responsibilities for improving sweatshop labor conditions to employers, since improvements may be economically unfeasible for individual employers, who themselves face tight economic options.

Ashford's point is about responsibilities for reforming choice situations -- e.g., between sweatshop labor and inadequate subsistence -- that are both unjustifiable to those facing the choice and empirically unnecessary (at least on certain assumptions about how the global economy could operate). Alan Wertheimer also addresses the phenomenon of resorting to dire choices in severe poverty, but takes up the distinct question of when the consent of people making such choices could nonetheless be valid, i.e., normatively transformative. Focusing on cases of consent to participate in research, Wertheimer argues that voluntariness in the descriptive sense of having acceptable alternatives is not necessary for valid consent. Wertheimer's point is interestingly compatible with Ashford's. It would have been nice to see the two contributors engage more closely with each other's essays and how they might relate (especially since the volume grew out of a conference).

Trafficking is another topic on which contributors might have fruitfully interacted. Leslie Francis and John Francis utilize the framework of existing anti-trafficking law to propose increased legal enforcement as a feasible and appropriate response, while also acknowledging that particular legal interpretations, changes in enforcement culture, and, in some jurisdictions, legal reform may be necessary to prevent increased enforcement from actually making the problem worse by fueling fear and mistrust among trafficking victims. John Christman, meanwhile, wages a wholesale attack on the idea of trying to address the problem of trafficking through existing legal frameworks. Francis and Francis's essay can be read as a subtle response to Christman's criticisms.

The volume contains numerous positive proposals on institutional reform. Many are provocative and will, I hope, trigger further discussion. Some, like Francis and Francis's argument on enforcement and Anca Gheaus's interesting argument for labor-exporting states' responsibilities over migrants' children, are anchored in fairly developed areas of human rights law and are, correspondingly, quite specific. Most of the proposals, however, remain schematic, and so leave the reader wanting to see the details more rigorously fleshed out. Consider, for example, Allen's argument that the right to development needs to be fleshed out in terms of a "pluralistic understanding of human rights obligations," on which individual states are both allowed and required to advance the interests and rights of their own citizens, subject to the constraint that individual state policies do not together undermine "the possibility of protecting human rights worldwide" (265). Allen argues that the pluralistic conception is superior to both the "state-centric" view, which makes non-state development obligations conditional upon states discharging their obligations fully, and the "internationalist conception," on which all state and non-state actors have direct obligations to promote the right to development. Allen then concludes that the pluralistic conception would, in "practical terms . . . entail an obligation to restructure the existing international financial and political institutions and renegotiate existing debt and trade agreements to make them fairer and more equitable to the developing world" (266). But this is a particular, certainly not obvious, interpretation of the requirement to act consistent with the "possibility of protecting human rights worldwide," for which Allen does not provide much argument. In "practical terms," it of course makes all the difference in the world whether the pluralistic conception yields obligations as robust as reforming international trade and financial institutions, or instead is compatible with the status quo and its default of political inaction.

Similar worries apply to Diana Meyers's argument for "a capacious moral category of economic refugees" (85). Meyers believes that this conclusion follows from an understanding of poverty in a national economy with a large deficit in decent work as a coercive choice situation, in which undocumented migration is the least hazardous of available options. But even if the point about coercion is correct, more needs to be said about why the solution needs to include recognizing economic refugees, rather than aiding the challenged national economies. Other proposals, such as Claudia Card's interesting suggestion that we attune policy to poverty that is "evil," or rises to an injustice that involves intolerable harm and admits of no moral excuse, presuppose previous or forthcoming work.

Nonetheless, the policy suggestions in this volume are helpful in identifying empowerment as an important and independent objective of reform. Take, for example, Ann Cudd's comparative assessments of the Grameen Bank's microcredit scheme, Nike's anti-exploitation initiative, and Cemex's commercial partnerships. Cudd's argument for the Cemex model over the other two relies importantly on the kinds of participation and agenda-setting opportunities afforded to the intended beneficiaries. Human rights practitioners have been stressing the importance of community participation and stakeholder engagement for some time,[4] so it is helpful to see, even in outline, what a philosophical argument for incorporating these considerations would look like.

[1] Makau Mutua, Human Rights: A Political and Cultural Critique (Philadelphia: University of Pennsylvania Press, 2008), pp. 10, 11.

[2] Universal Declaration of Human Rights preamble, G.A. Res. 217A (III), U.N. GAOR, 3rd Sess., pt. 1, at 71, U.N. Doc. A/810 (1948).

[3] I cannot help but note, though, that the book's cover photography, like many visual accompaniments to work on human rights and development, strongly suggests the victim-as-"powerless, helpless innocent" metaphor.

[4] See, for example, recent calls for "community-based human rights impact assessments" .