How to Be a Pyrrhonist: The Practice and Significance of Pyrrhonian Skepticism

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Richard Bett, How to Be a Pyrrhonist: The Practice and Significance of Pyrrhonian Skepticism, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 263pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108471077.

Reviewed by Máté Veres, ELTE, Budapest/CEU, Budapest


Perhaps the most popular strategy in recent decades to reinvigorate the study of ancient philosophy has been to present ancient philosophical tenets, notably those of Stoics and Epicureans, as motivating and grounding particular ways of life. Richard Bett has long argued that ancient Skeptics are worth considering from this point of view, since they also aimed, though arguably failed, to offer an attractive way of leading one's life. As he concluded in his first published article on ancient Skepticism, it is difficult 'to fathom the frame of mind in which this [i.e., the Skeptical] way of life could seem both possible and desirable', which is no doubt the reason 'why Pyrrhonism never achieved anything like the popular appeal of Stoicism or Epicureanism'.[1]

In this book, Bett brings together a representative selection of his papers dealing not only with skeptical argumentative strategies but also, and more emphatically, with the practical stance, self-understanding, and self-presentation of ancient Pyrrhonists. Despite its title, which suggests -- perhaps playfully -- a manual for adopting the Pyrrhonist stance, How to Be a Pyrrhonist retains the perspective of a scholar sympathetic to, but ultimately dissatisfied with, the Skeptical outlook. Of the twelve papers included, eleven are either already published or forthcoming. Chapter 6, 'The Modes in Sextus: Theory and Practice', was written specifically for this volume. It gives an overview of recent work on the Modes for suspending one's judgement and argues for the surprising conclusion that they are not especially congenial to Sextus' philosophical project. Together with the preceding two chapters on earlier Pyrrhonist treatments of sign-inference and of natural philosophy (Chapters 4-5), the discussion of the Modes is the closest the volume comes to treating another of Bett's scholarly preoccupations, the historical development of ancient Pyrrhonism.[2]

In what follows, I shall not be able to do justice to the volume's richness, but venture only to examine three claims that emerge throughout its chapters. The first is that Sextus' Pyrrhonism does not allow for philosophical inquiry 'in any normal sense of the term' (8). In addition to this familiar claim, Bett suggests that Sextus consciously plays different notions of philosophical inquiry off against each other, so as to suspend judgement about the nature of philosophy itself. The second claim is that Sextus cannot in good faith present the goal of tranquility as anything more than a momentary preference. If correct, this lands a major blow to the appeal of Pyrrhonism, since Skeptical argumentation makes little sense without the promise of tranquility. Finally, Bett posits an important diachronic shift: he argues that universal suspension of judgement has become unavailable to us, largely due to the progress of natural science.

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One of Bett's recurring claims is that Sextus is not a genuine philosopher, since in his works, 'the project of inquiry seems to be replaced by a project of developing an expertise in the production of equally powerful arguments' (7, see also 125 with n41, 175-6). A Sextan skeptic is someone who first engaged in inquiry in order to achieve a tranquil state of mind by discovering the truth, but eventually became disenchanted with the enterprise of philosophical inquiry as she found a route to tranquility through suspension of judgment (4-8). Bett discusses earlier interpretations along these lines, and goes on to pose a series of related questions, most notably: why would someone with this mindset produce works of philosophy (Chapter 1) and go out of their way to carve out a niche for Pyrrhonism among philosophical positions with apparent affinities (Chapter 2)?

In response, Bett suggests that Sextus is a subversive thinker, someone in the business not only of arguing against non-Skeptical views but also of undermining the philosophical enterprise.[3] Sextus deliberately switches back and forth between presenting Pyrrhonism as a kind of philosophy and dismissing philosophy altogether, so as to bring about a state of puzzlement concerning the nature of philosophy itself (15-7). Sextus' effort to distinguish Pyrrhonism from neighboring philosophies is part of the same strategy, rejecting among others the idea that one's stance could or should be justified in relation to one's philosophical ancestors (42-4). A similar story can be told about the status of the Skeptic's non-philosophical attitudes (17-20) and about the Skeptic's 'strategic trickery' (23) in employing a variety of argumentative schemes, which perhaps shows that there is no royal road to suspension of judgement (20-3). The first section culminates in Chapter 3 which situates ancient Skepticism in the broader context of humour as a subversive tactic in ancient philosophy.

Bett points out early on that equipollence, the principle or the starting-point (archê) of Skepticism, 'has nothing to do with the search for the truth, everything to do with the preconditions for suspension of judgement' (7). However, this seems to follow only if a diligent seeker after truth would not find that there are equally convincing considerations for and against any given theoretical proposition. In the relevant passage of the Outlines of Pyrrhonism (PH 1.12), the equipollence of opposing arguments is the second of two archai which Sextus invokes in order to account for the origin of Pyrrhonism (as acknowledged by Bett on 155). The first archê, the hope of tranquility, is said to apply to a group of individuals who experienced conflicting appearances and were troubled by their inability to decide which ones are true and which are false. It is these individuals who are then confronted by equipollent arguments, and given the first stage of their intellectual journey, it appears much less evident that equipollence has nothing to do with their search for the truth.

The precise interpretation of the origin-story is subject to longstanding scholarly debate. At the very least, however, one could maintain that the first archê applies to all those individuals who got involved in philosophical inquiry, and that only the second archê singles out the eventual Skeptics, i.e., those who considered the arguments on both sides and came to suspend their judgement. If this is the case, then Skeptics share their background motivation with dogmatic philosophers, which gives them a straightforward reason to write -- namely, to counterbalance the claims that happened to convince fellow inquisitive minds in order to bring their colleagues into a state of suspensive tranquility.[4] As further support for this reading, one could invoke the famous Sextan claim to philanthropy, which is something that Bett finds hard to take seriously (10, 185).

It is of course a further question whether Sextus' suggestion that dogmatic philosophers ultimately seek tranquility can be justified. At any rate, once we accept this much for the sake of the argument, the Skeptic appears to be much less of a 'subversive without a cause'. Rather, the Skeptic is someone who thinks that her non-Skeptical colleagues made a mistake by opting for a position which is just as unsatisfactory as its rival alternatives. In addition, since dogmatists tend to be convinced by a range of tenets which differ not only in their content but also with regard to their manner of justification, the Skeptic's reliance on diverse methods of counter-argumentation might also appear compatible with a project which seeks equipollence rather than the definitive disruption of philosophical inquiry.

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According to Sextus' official position, the Skeptic's goal (telos) is tranquility in matters of opinion coupled with moderation of feeling in matters forced upon us (PH 1.25, 30), a state which is the fortuitous result of universal suspension of judgement. Bett argues in Chapters 7-9 that someone who endorses this goal at best possesses a 'contingent and dispensable', 'pared-down' self (147), and is unable to live an ethically robust life, opting instead for a life of 'conformity without conformism' (178, emphasis in the original), acting on their preferences without holding definite beliefs about right and wrong. These considerations presumably suffice to discourage anyone not already predisposed to Pyrrhonism from taking the perilous road down to universal suspension, especially since the prize promised by Sextus, a lukewarm state of being somewhat better-off than others, is not nearly as enticing as the happiness promised by earlier Pyrrhonians (Chapter 10).

According to a familiar objection, Sextus cannot consistently propose any goal, since the statement of a goal should be grounded in some tenet concerning what one should aim at in order to live a good human life. Bett's Sextus responds that the above combination of tranquility and moderation is only a momentary preference, something that the Skeptic happens to aim at. At PH 1.25, Sextus qualifies his telos-formula in two ways: he states that it is the goal of the Skeptic, not of humanity at large, and he adds that it is the Skeptic's goal achri nun, 'up to now' (36 n28, 142 with n11, 163, 195-7). Bett reads the latter qualification as suggesting that Sextus is anxious to avoid commitment even to his own stated goal. This point is brought out most clearly on page 205, in a piece of imagined Pyrrhonist monologue:

'We Pyrrhonists like the combination of ataraxia and moderate feeling that I have described. At least, we like it so far (who knows whether we may change our minds?). But of course we would not be so rash as to suggest that this is what it is, in general, for a human being to live well; that would be committing ourselves to far too much. No, this is just what we happen to prefer.'

Going by this paraphrase, Bett's Pyrrhonist is caught on the horns of a false dilemma. Facing the threat of quasi-dogmatic commitment to some view on the human good, she retreats all the way to stating only what she happens to enjoy on a whim. Bett even suggests that a Skeptic might give up suspensive tranquility when something more enticing, such as the popping of a Prozac, comes within her reach (145-6). Yet if we remind ourselves of the description of the Pyrrhonist in terms of the two archai above, a third option presents itself. To someone who sets out to inquire in order to achieve intellectual tranquility but finds only equipollent arguments, the tranquil state brought about by suspension might in fact be preferable to its dogmatic alternative. The Pyrrhonist telos appears to suit the enduring disposition of such an individual, without being based on an appraisal of what could make for a flourishing life. In addition, Sextus' refusal to identify this state with eudaimonia leaves open the possibility that a state better than the one enjoyed by the Skeptic, one possibly with universal appeal, might still be discovered.

Another discrepancy identified by Bett concerns Sextus' two, incompatible analyses of disturbance (tarachê). First, as stated in the origin-story, the desire to know combined with ignorance of the truth is disturbing. Hence one can become tranquil either by discovering the truth or by suspending one's judgement. Second, it is also suggested that the holding of beliefs about natural value -- i.e., about things being good, bad, and indifferent by nature -- is disturbing, and hence the removal of any such belief leads to tranquility, whether or not the given belief happens to be true. This is problematic not only because it is hard to square the lack of value-belief with that of a tranquil state of mind -- as Bett points out, dogmatists are often happier or more resilient than those without value-beliefs -- but also because the first analysis allows for, while the second denies, the possibility of tranquility through discovery (155-8, 172-4, 180-3, 228-9).

In response, one could suggest the following. The second analysis of tarachê is only a special case of the first: suspension of judgement about natural value is simply a special case of suspending judgement. Furthermore, the second analysis concerns mere beliefs concerning apparent goods. Sextus' philosophical environment was familiar with the distinction between pursuing apparent goods, which leads to increased turmoil and disturbance, and organizing one's life around what is known to be good. Sextus' dialectical proposal, then, is to treat the rival candidates for the good as merely apparent goods, insofar as the arguments in their support are equally convincing (compare PH 3.238). None of this is to say that Sextus has a compelling case, only that his account might be coherent after all; and if it is coherent, then tranquility can remain the focus of a Pyrrhonist life.

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In the concluding chapter, Bett makes the case that universal suspension of judgement 'is no longer a realistic option' (239, see also 183-4). Admittedly, disagreement still rages in the domain of ethics, politics, religion, and philosophy; and modern philosophy of science even enabled us to disagree over scientific realism, an option which was unavailable to ancient Skeptics (218-20, 237). At the same time, Bett points out, modern science has created 'a huge, systematic body of findings . . . supported by massive evidence, that are not subject to equally plausible opposing arguments' (234).

Is, then, Pyrrhonism defeated by scientific progress? One's preferred answer will probably depend on one's view about how much of this success and its products ordinary life can absorb. Sextus seems to allow for the possibility that some things are forced upon us by ordinary life in such a manner that they are simply not up for debate (PH 1.210-11), so that they do not even trigger inquiry. It is at the very least arguable that, just as ancient Pyrrhonists could practice various arts and crafts (PH 1.24), a modern Pyrrhonist might become a pragmatic scientist of sorts (a possibility which Bett rejects, 238 n26), treating scientific facts and procedures as part and parcel of an inherited set of customs that she follows and uses in a purely conformist manner. If that is possible, then there might be a way to resist Bett's argument from scientific progress -- even if it seems to involve a willing, if not overzealous, suspension of disbelief.[5]

My discussion, I hope, gives a sense of the scope of Bett's book and the interest it holds for anyone working on the practical side of ancient Pyrrhonism. The volume not only highlights key issues and treats them in a careful way sure to inspire scholars and students to measure their readings against those of Bett, but also documents a scholarly life lived with Pyrrhonism.[6]

[1] 'Scepticism as a way of life and scepticism as 'pure theory'', in M. Whitby, P.R. Hardie, and M. Whitby (eds.), Homo Viator: Classical Essays for John Bramble. Bristol Classical Press and Bolchazy-Carducci, 49-57, at 56.

[2] In the introduction, Bett gives a helpful summary of his main interests and the ways in which his thinking has evolved (x-xi).

[3] Sextus' project of discrediting all candidates for belief on a given issue is also described as 'subverting belief' (223); that Sextus was not the first Skeptic with a subversive bent is suggested by the remark that Aenesidemus had 'the goal of subverting confidence in the physical theories of others' (90).

[4] In a forthcoming paper ('Is Skepticism Natural? Ancient and Modern Perspectives', in K. Arenson ed., The Routledge Handbook of Hellenistic Philosophy), Bett is edging closer to such a view. He contrasts Sextus' two descriptions of Skepticism, one which takes it to be an ability which requires deliberate, active, and ongoing effort to rid oneself of belief, and another on which naturally inquisitive minds are from the very beginning drawn to Skepticism. The origin-story as presented above closes the gap between these two accounts: inquisitive minds, unless fooled by the credentials of some dogmatic view, naturally come to acquire the capacity for oppositions.

[5] Somewhat more imaginatively, the Skeptic might turn to the argument from possible disagreement (PH 1.33-4) and transform it into something resembling the pessimistic meta-induction -- a move which, of course, would almost surely remove the possibility of eventual discovery.

[6] The volume is excellently produced. I noticed one typo: on page 158, read 'to [the] effect'.