Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy: Volume XX

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David Sedley (ed.), Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy: Volume XX, Oxford University Press (Clarendon), 2001, 352 pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-199-24586-X.

Reviewed by John E. Sisko, College of William and Mary


Under the editorship of David Sedley, OSAP continues to flourish as a source for outstanding scholarly papers on topics in ancient philosophy. It also continues to be the only source for papers of substantial length in this area. The shift to publishing not once but twice yearly (initiated last year with volume XVIII) has not caused even the slightest reduction in philosophical quality. The current volume contains five articles on Aristotle and three on Plato, together with one critical notice. The volume is perhaps less broad than most of the previous volumes, but it contains works which are both strikingly original and philosophically significant. In what follows, I provide a general overview of each article and, on occasion, I offer brief criticism or commendation. My chief aim is to make manifest the positive philosophical worth of the volume as a whole.

Mark Gifford’s article, “Dramatic Dialectic in Republic Book I” is doubly bounteous. It is bounteous in length (running a full seventy-nine pages) and it is bounteous in scholarly importance. No educator who reads this article shall ever again pass over Socrates’ refutations of Cephalus and Polemarchus as if they were unimportant preambles to Socrates’ discussion with Thrasymachus. Gifford shows that these early refutations are rich with ‘external dramatic irony’ (40). Plato’s contemporaries knew much about the lives of Cephalus and Polemarchus and, according to Gifford, Plato capitalizes on this knowledge in order to furnish the reader with a pair of concrete demonstrations of the truth that the unexamined life is not worth living (47-8). Just as the audience’s knowledge of the story of Oedipus allows Sophocles to expose the profound depths of Oedipus’ ignorance (take, for example, the double import of Oedipus’ curse upon the murderer of Laius), so too does the reader’s knowledge of Cephalus and Polemarchus allow Plato to expose the depths of their ignorance (42 & 97). In depicting the ignorance of these characters, Plato is able to elicit the tragic emotion of fear in the reader and, in so doing, he motivates the reader to engage in philosophical enquiry himself (101-3). In brief, Gifford reveals the tragic irony of both Polemarchus’ account of justice and Socrates’ attack on Cephalus’ account. Polemarchus, in claiming that justice is a matter of helping friends and harming enemies, unwittingly legitimates his own future execution by the government of the thirty tyrants (88-91). Socrates condemns Cephalus’ philosophically naïve account of justice (keeping to your own financial obligations without breaking promises to anyone) with the counter-example of giving battle gear to a madman and, in so doing, he also condemns Cephalus’ own life. For Cephalus was a prominent manufacturer of hoplite battle shields for the Athenian war effort (72-79). (Notice that Plato uses hopla at 331C6 and this, unlike xiphei ê schoiniôi ê allôi tini, which we find in the Dissoi Logoi 3.4, has direct bearing on Cephalus’ chosen profession.) Gifford’s interpretation is not just linked to the texts. It is cemented to them. Thus, his account of the ‘literary’ side of this part of the Republic shall appeal to even the most analytically-minded reader.

Stephen Gardiner, in “Aristotle’s Basic and Non-basic Virtues”, offers a critical assessment of the conventional view that, for Aristotle, all of the moral virtues are reciprocally entailing (RV). Following T. Irwin, Gardiner notes that RV is not consistent with certain of Aristotle’s claims regarding the virtues of magnificence and magnanimity. For example, it is not consistent with Aristotle’s claim that one can be liberal without being magnificent (see EN IV.2, 1122a28-29). But, while Irwin accepts RV as a legitimate Aristotelian thesis, Gardiner does not. Instead, he contends that Aristotle is only committed to the reciprocity of the basic virtues (RBV) and neither magnificence nor magnanimity is a basic virtue. Thus, according to Gardiner, Aristotle’s reciprocity thesis (now RBV and not RV) is consistent with Aristotle’s own treatment of magnificence and magnanimity. Gardiner’s case rests on two points: (1) He argues that magnificence and magnanimity each govern an “essentially relative good” and, as such, each of these virtues is necessarily inaccessible to most people (279). Each is a non-basic virtue: a virtue that is needed for happiness under all circumstances, but is not needed for happiness under normal circumstances (278). (2) Gardiner suggests that the key passage which has been taken to demand RV (EN VI.13, 1144b35-1145a2), actually demands only RBV. Aristotle observes that, while a particular dialectical argument for the separateness of the virtues may be possible for the natural virtues, “…it is not possible with those in respect of which someone is called good unconditionally. For all are present at the same time as practical wisdom, which is a single state” (265). Gardiner argues that unconditional goodness does not require all of the genuine moral virtues. It requires only the basic virtues: those virtues that are needed for happiness under normal circumstances (265, esp. n.9).

The aim of saving Aristotle from inconsistency is a noble one, and Gardiner’s thesis may well be correct. However, worries can be raised over (1) and (2), and these worries cast appreciable doubt upon the overall thesis. First, one might question Gardiner’s contention that magnificence governs the essentially relative good of being systematically better off than most people (279). By making relative wealth the determining factor of magnificence, Gardiner introduces a pleonastic element into magnificence and he also distances this virtue from its proper object: the public good. Possessing the wealth that is necessary to fund choruses no longer makes a citizen a candidate for magnificence, if a goodly number of his fellow citizens possess a similar level of wealth. Thus, Gardiner’s account implies that those who are objectively well off may need to strive for even greater wealth in order to remain candidates for magnificence. I prefer to take it to be a contingent fact that few can reach the level of wealth that makes one a candidate for magnificence. But then under this interpretation, as Gardiner himself points out, it is still plausible to hold that a citizen must possess such wealth, if he is to be unconditionally good (279). Further, since the proper object of magnificence is the public good, Gardiner’s relativistic account seems to require that once enough citizens can afford to fund choruses or banquets, this sort of activity ceases to aim at the public good. Yet, no doubt, theatre is a public good, even if many citizens can afford to provide it with funding. Second and more importantly, one might question Gardiner’s contention that the virtues that are necessary for unconditional goodness are merely a proper subset of the genuine ethical virtues. In EN VI.13 Aristotle compares natural virtue with ethical virtue. He claims that ethical virtue alone is “virtue in the strict sense” (pros tên kyrian; 1144b3-4) and it alone is “good in the strict sense” (to kyriôs agathon; 1144b7). So, when he goes on to compare natural virtue to the virtues that “are said to be unconditionally good” haplos legetai agathos; 1145a1), it is most likely that he is continuing this comparison between natural virtue and ethical virtue. If this is correct, then the virtues which are said to be unconditionally good are the ethical virtues and not the natural virtues. Since both magnificence and magnanimity are ethical virtues, these (pace Gardiner) are to be included among the virtues that are unconditionally good.

Mohan Matthen, in “The Holistic Presuppositions of Aristotle’s Cosmology”, argues that Aristotle’s corporeal universe of aether, fire, air, water and earth is one substance which, together with the Prime Mover, constitutes a self-mover (171). Matthen maintains that, while Aristotle’s universe is a hylomorphic substance, the conditions of unity which characterize this substance are weaker than the conditions which characterize a paradigmatic self-moving hylomorphic whole: an animal (197-199). According to Matthen, Aristotle’s universe is akin to a polis. It is a natural substance which comprehends other substances such that its telos coexists with a multiplicity of individual goals in its constituent members (183 & 195-198). Matthen’s thesis is intriguing, for he challenges a widely held presumption. Scholars agree that, for Aristotle, the motion of the sublunary elements depends upon the motion of the aetherial spheres (and upon the motion of the sun in particular). However, most think that the Prime Mover together with just the aether constitutes a composite entity and so most think that the motion of the sublunary elements is a motion of that which stands ontologically outside of this divine unity. Matthen challenges the presumption that the sublunary elements are not organic parts of the divine composite entity.

As I see it, there is at least one potential weakness within Matthen’s paper. In order to support the case for organic unity, he must demonstrate that the elements are parts of a whole (i.e., the universe) such that they depend for their existence upon the whole. He attempts to do this by arguing both that the natural place of each element is defined by reference to the whole and that each element is programmed to rest in its natural place (180). The difficulty is that, while Matthen shows awareness of Mary Louise Gill’s recent challenge to the view that each element possesses a nature that can be characterized in relation to its natural place, he provides no direct rebuttal of her position. Gill contends that each element has an internal principle of directional motion, but lacks an internal principle of rest. She states, “Fire is not programmed to stop at the periphery – it would proceed indefinitely if it were not confined by the sphere of the moon; and water would progress downward indefinitely were it not eventually stopped by the heavier mass of earth below” (Gill, 261). Gill’s thesis is certainly plausible. In fact, I submit that it must be correct in regard to the elemental nature of water (and also air). For, in De Caelo IV.5, when discussing the heaviness and lightness of the elements, Aristotle states, “…if support is removed, it goes to the body next beneath it, air to the place of water, water to the place of earth” (312b6-8). This shows that, for Aristotle, neither water nor air rests in its natural place, but instead each of these elements strives, in accordance with its own nature, to move beyond its ‘natural place’ and toward the center of the universe. If Gill’s thesis is correct, then the waters that lie in the deepest regions of the sea are no more at rest than is some small amount of water that is held cupped within my hands. But, since water cupped within my hands is not a proper or natural part of myself, a single hylomorphic compound, it would seem to follow that water lying within the sea is not a proper or natural part of the divine hylomorphic compound. Since Matthen offers no direct rebuttal of Gill’s thesis, his own argument for organic unity remains suspect.

Those who are not fans of the wild metaphysical flights found in the Meno and the Phaedo, and yet are encouraged by Plato’s move towards a more hylomorphic account of soul and body in the Timaeus, shall be greatly pleased with Frisbee Sheffield’s fine discussion of the innatist position advanced in the Symposium. In “Psychic Pregnancy and Platonic Epistemology”, Sheffield investigates the lover’s progress toward virtue. She takes seriously Plato’s contention that the lover who encounters beauty needs to bring forth his own conception (15-16; cf. Symposium 206D1-2). Sheffield argues that the lover has all the resources for knowledge potentially within himself and needs only to work through the appropriate systematic processes in order to come to ‘give birth’ to real virtue. According to Sheffield, the lover’s psychic pregnancy begins as an innate teleologically directed potentiality (13). Thus, it is something more than just an ability to derive knowledge from experience, and yet it does not require that the soul pre-exist the body (24-25). The soul’s potentiality to develop knowledge is analogous to the embryo’s potentiality to develop into a complete human being (23). According to Sheffield, the soul has certain structural features which are the basis for its potential and, thus, Plato’s innatist account in the Symposium is one in which the soul is not presumed to have existed at a pre-natal time in which it actually learned. Sheffield shows quite clearly that the account in the Symposium is free from some of the wild metaphysical flights found in Plato’s earlier writings (30-33).

The remaining article on Plato is Gabriela Roxana Carone’s “Akrasia in the Republic: Does Plato Change his Mind?”. Carone’s thesis is that Plato’s treatment of ‘weakness of will’ in the Republic does not mark a departure from the Socratic thesis advanced in the Protagoras (107-8). Carone contends that the account in Republic IV follows that in the Protagoras in so far as it rules out synchronic belief-akrasia while allowing for diachronic belief-akrasia (139). The central issue is whether reason can exercise a belief which is opposed to a desire or an affection of one of the non-rational parts of the soul at the very moment when this non-rational part bests reason and the agent engages in action in pursuit its non-rational ends. Carone points out that Plato’s example of Leontius and the corpses is not one in which reason is said to oppose desire (137). She is right about this. However, she goes on to argue that it is consistent with the text of the Republic to suppose that whenever a non-rational part of the soul bests reason and the agent is moved to action, this is a result of reason having been weakened such that it comes to adopt the belief of the prevailing non-rational part of the soul (137-8). Carone’s case is worthy of serious consideration. Her paper is well argued and her thesis certainly stands as a challenge to the currently prevalent view. However, I am not fully convinced. I agree that it is plausible to suppose that in any case in which reason plays an instrumental role, in an executive moment, to bring the agent to pursue non-rational ends, then, at this very moment, reason is not strictly opposed to the relevant non-rational part of the soul. But, one of the things that the example of Leontius is meant to show is that a human can be moved to action without reason playing any instrumental role whatsoever. This strongly suggests that, for Plato, it is possible for reason to be bested such that a non-rational part of the soul moves the agent to action without it being the case that (a weakened) reason comes at that very moment to adopt the belief of this non-rational part.

The volume includes three papers on especially technical Aristotelian issues. These papers are both demanding and intricate, and a brief review cannot begin to do them justice. In “Aristotle’s Scientific Demonstrations as Expositions of Essence”, Richard Tierney argues that, for Aristotle, scientific demonstrations do not involve explanation, instead they are primarily logico-deductive expositions in which the essential nature of a subject kind is revealed (152-154 & 169-170). According to Tierney, the chief purpose of a scientific deduction is to give rise to understanding (152). The greatest strength of Tierney’s study is found in his thorough analysis of the role played by the concepts of ti ên einai, ti esti, ousia, genos and diaphora in Aristotle’s treatment of demonstration. Thomas Buchheim, in “The Functions of the Concept of Physis in Aristotle’s Metaphysics”, argues that physis plays four functions in the Metaphysics. physis (1) unifies material substances, (2) makes concrete things definable, (3) makes non-natural unity determinable, and (4) orders the whole of the sublunary world (202 & 217-8). Buchheim’s investigation into the role of physis in unifying natural substances is the most impressive part of the article. He argues that physis is the self-causing form of a living thing and as such it is primarily the nutritive part of the soul (231-2). In “Aristotle’s Attack on Universals”, Mary Louise Gill argues that Aristotle’s own objections, in Metaphysics Z.13, to the (Platonic) idea that universals are substances are damaging to the notion of substantial form, whether such form be universal or particular (236 & 248-255). There are two difficulties. First, if form is substance, then within a composite, a form will be the substance of two things (itself and the composite). Second, if form is not a substance, then a non-substance will be prior to the substance which it, in part, constitutes. Gill contends that Aristotle offers a solution to these difficulties in Metaphysics H.6. In that chapter, Aristotle’s analysis allows that substantial form is predicated of the composite (and the matter), while at the same time the composite is not something whose being is distinct from that of its substantial form (258).

The volume ends with a critical notice. Christopher Gill looks at J. Beversluis’ Speaking Up for Plato’s Interlocutors. Gill’s chief criticism is that if Beversluis is correct and Socrates is systematically unfair to his interlocutors, then we are left with a rather questionable picture of Plato as an author who could not see through the figure he depicted with “devastating accuracy” (312).