Pacificism: A Philosophy of Nonviolence

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Robert L. Holmes, Pacificism: A Philosophy of Nonviolence, Bloomsbury, 2017, 346pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781474279833.

Reviewed by Cheyney Ryan, University of Oxford


Recently, America's top commander in Afghanistan stated that without more troops, the conflict "threatens to become a stalemate". He was speaking of a conflict 15 years old and counting. A former Pentagon official (Rosa Brooks) titles her much discussed book How Everything Became War and the Military Became Everything: Tales from the Pentagon, evoking Charles Beard's description of today as "permanent war for permanent peace". War vanished for a while from political philosophy at the end of the Cold War. The few papers on the topic at APA meetings were shunted off to sessions on "military ethics", a reflection of the emerging mindset that militaries had little relation to ordinary citizens and their political concerns. But the events of 9/11 jarringly reminded people that history had not ended and neither had war -- and its centrality to political life. This led to today's robust discussions of just war theory and with it an interest in pacifism. Robert L. Holmes has been one of those who never lost sight of war's importance and the urgency of crafting alternatives. His On War and Morality (1989) exemplified early on how analytical thinking could be directed at these problems. His collection The Ethics of Nonviolence (2013) brought together his reflections over many years on theoretical and practical issues. His new book will be a reference point for all further discussions of the topic.

Just war thinkers and pacifists have generally ignored each other, partly because, as Holmes notes, their questions have been different. Just war thinkers have traditionally asked, "How do we distinguish just from unjust wars?", thus assuming that war is sometimes morally permissible, while pacifists ask what Holmes calls "the basic moral question of war", "Is war ever morally permissible?" But "revisionist" just war theorists have recently made space for the latter question. Their efforts have focused on describing the rights-based conditions that a war must satisfy to be just. While most of them assume there are in fact just wars, they leave open the possibility that once the conditions are specified we may find that no actual war satisfies them, or we may even conclude it's unlikely any actual war will ever satisfy them. This opens the door to "contingent pacifism", in ways that obviously blur the distinction between the just war and the pacifist frameworks. Michael Walzer has bemoaned how pacifism can thus emerge within the just war framework, leading to a "radical suspicion" attractive to "people who do not expect to exercise power", whereas just war theory proper "is the doctrine of people who do expect to exercise power".[1] Some might view such radical suspicion as healthy skepticism, fitting for those who conceive of themselves as philosophers rather than political consultants. The problem in the past has been that if an argument led to pacifism it was rejected out of hand, regardless of its intrinsic merits. But now, revisionist just war theory has made principled discussions of these matters possible.

Discussions of pacifism typically begin with its meaning, or rather meanings, as they are multiple. In my own writings, I distinguish two traditions of pacifism. Personal pacifists focus on the individual act: war is never permissible because the act of killing is never permissible; a pacifist refrains from war because he or she refrains from killing in any context. Political pacifists focus on social institutions: they oppose war as a social practice, much as many today oppose capital punishment as a social practice. Their objection is not to killing per se but to the kind of killing that war involves (much as critics of capital punishment do not oppose killing per se but to the kind of killing it involves). This distinction is crucial for the question of self-defense. Personal pacifists do reject violence even in self-defense, but political pacifists feel they needn't do so anymore than death penalty opponents must reject it.

Most people today equate "pacifism" with personal pacifism, hence refutations of it quickly turn to hypotheticals about your aged grandparent being bludgeoned before your eyes. Historically, though, this position was called "non-resistance". One could argue the term "pacifism" was first coined to distinguish itself from this position. Personal pacifism first emerged from the "Turn the other cheek" ethic of Jesus. Political pacifism's origins are secular and more recent, emerging in the Enlightenment then coalescing in the 19th century in response to the Napoleonic Wars. What struck political pacifists was how war seemed to have acquired a life of its own, indifferent to any human purpose -- or agency. Hence, they have faulted war on two grounds: for its injustice, i.e. how it violates our rights, and for its inhumanity, i.e. how it inevitably acquires a life of its own. To explain the latter, they saw individual wars as expressions of underlying political structures called the "war system".

Holmes gestures towards personal pacifism in his last chapter on what he calls "existential pacifism". His discussion is cursory, because his principal focus is political pacifism -- which he defines as "the principled opposition to war", war being a "practice that is a detriment to humankind." (xvii-iii) Qua practice, then, his concern is not just individual acts of war but the war system, "the constellation of social, political, economic, religious and ethical practices and values necessary to being able to wage war effectively." (21)

From the start, though, there is an ambiguity in Holmes that we find in almost all discussions of pacifism. It involves what I call the distinction between "appraising" and "opposing". Pacifists are distinguished by how they appraise war, theoretically. That condemnation, we might say, is uncompromising. But they are also distinguished by how they oppose war, practically. Their opposition, we might say, is unyielding. These are distinct and their relation complex. To see this, consider the parallel with 19th-century abolitionism. Abolitionists agreed in their theoretical appraisal of slavery, i.e. their condemnation was uncompromising, but they disagreed -- often vehemently -- about what followed from this in practice. Some urged personal withdrawal from the slave system, others political mobilization, still others armed insurrection. So, too, pacifists have disagreed about what their appraisal meant for practical opposition. So these are different (albeit related) issues, yet Holmes runs them together, as when he begins Chapter 11 with pacifism terms for appraising war, then turns to an objection that speaks to its means of opposing war. He has interesting things to say on both, but his discussion would have been better served by keeping questions of theory and practice distinct. (If it's not obvious how you oppose a practice, it's not obvious how you support one either. People used to think that supporting a war committed you to serving in it yourself if need be. Few believe this anymore.[2])

Most of Holmes's energies are devoted to the theoretical question, which he approaches with his characteristic carefulness. But other pacifists might find him overly cautious in two respects.

First, his condemnation of war proves to be highly qualified. His terms it "pragmatic pacifism": "To be a pragmatic pacifist one need only hold that the large-scale, organized and systematic violence of war is impermissible in today's world." (265-266) This sounds reasonable enough, but consider how it impacts his argument. Part of his war critique appeals to specific cases to enhance his more theoretical considerations. But the ones he considers (Vietnam, Iraq, Kosovo) are all congenial to war-skepticism. In my experience, discussions of pacifism invariably stand or fall on the World War II case, yet Holmes states that his pragmatic pacifism limits itself to war in "the modern world" "specifically to avoid a discussion of WWII -- which is a special case and a complex one -- I mean war from the time of WWII and extending into the foreseeable future." (238) To me, its specialness is why it needs addressing. Most people will acknowledge that the vast majority of wars in history have been complete idiocy, but what World War II shows (they'd argue) is why pacifism is ultimately unacceptable. I also think it grates against Holmes's basic framework. If the object of his critique is the war system, surely that is not unique to recent times; indeed, viewing it as a "system" suggests the opposite.

His argument is also overly tentative. As this is a feature of many arguments for pacifism today, I begin with a general comment.

Discussions of pacifism often begin by sorting out "good" pacifism from "bad" pacifism, "bad" pacifism being characterized as "absolutist" so that pacifists seeking credibility quickly distance themselves from that sin. One reason is the aforementioned identification of "pacifism" with personal pacifism and its opposition to the individual act of killing. But I'd suggest that when the concern is social practices the meaning of "absolutist" is less clear. Sometimes it means that the pacifist's condemnation of war is oblivious to the nature of actually existing war. But this is a diagnosis, not an argument, which left to itself is just bare assertion. (For every delusion that has been advanced against war I can give you a thousand that have been advanced in favor of it). Sometimes it means that the pacifist's condemnation of war is unconditional, i.e. it is not dependent on the kind of war at hand. Holmes, like some "contingent pacifists", seems to feel there is something dogmatic about this, hence insists that the "possibility" of a just war cannot be foreclosed. We cannot predict the future. But surely the dogmatism concern depends on the practice at hand. After all, we unconditionally condemn lynching; indeed, the idea that we should we should remain "open-minded" enough to assess each new case as it comes along is not just absurd but an insult to those who've been lynched. Moreover, most just war theorists unconditionally oppose certain practices within war, like the slaughter of innocents. So the difference between them and pacifists is not "absolutism" per se but where it is placed.

The tentativeness informs the structure of his argument, which claims to show that there is a moral presumption against war that has not been defeated -- yet. This moral presumption rests on the centrality of killing to war and the moral presumption against it. He argues that the resulting presumption against war has not been defeated either by just war arguments, traditional or revisionist, or by historical cases. The upshot is that war is wrong and likely to remain so. Now by itself, as he acknowledges, showing there is a presumption against war isn't hard. There have been about 15,000 wars in recorded history, about 3,200 major ones. But except for World War II it's hard to find a single war that people agree was just. There'd be a strong presumption against capital punishment too if in all its recorded instances 99% of those executed were innocent. The important question is why there is such a presumption, which Holmes says involves its killing. His discussion of killing is lucid and thorough. The most problematic part of his argument is its distinction between "partial" war, i.e. war as the actions of one side against the other, and "whole" war, i.e. war as the sum total of the event, and his stress on the importance of a moral presumption against both. It struck me that most of what he wanted to say about "whole" war was implicit in condemning war as a practice.

But to show that the moral presumption against war had not been defeated does not mean, he insists, that "it cannot be defeated by any conceivable argument", only that one has not been produced, nor does it mean "that it has not been defeated in long past wars" (e.g. the American Revolution) or "could not be defeated with regard to hypothetical future wars." (238) One worry is whether all this open-mindedness does not qualify pacifism out of existence. For many, the possibility that we might face a just war in the future is reason enough to prepare for it, and thus maintain the war system that pacifism fundamentally rejects. I also worry that the argument may have shifted from the practice of war, and the presumption against it, to the act of war, and the presumption against it. They differ, among other things in what's needed to "defeat" them. Consider the practice of dueling (often likened to war in its obsolescence). The moral presumption against the practice of dueling means an unconditional condemnation of it in our society. But this is compatible with acknowledging that two people might have good reasons for engaging in something like a duel in the future. This does not shake us because we assume that the moral benefit of allowing for a single instance of dueling pales next to the moral cost of permitting the practice generally, or prohibiting it only with lots of escape clauses. This is because "dueling" is a practice: it is not just two people shooting at each other, nor is its impermissibility just a matter of its killing; it is a matter of the whole cluster of notions contained in it involving "honor", the private redress of wrongs, and the like which as much as anything have lost their moral point in light of other attitudes and arrangements we hold dear.

Let me relate this to how to conceive the practice of "war".

Holmes starts his book with Clausewitz, but I wonder if he has taken to heart Clausewitz's insistence that war is a political practice ("the continuation of politics by other means"). I take this to mean that while war fundamentally involves violence, specifically killing, it is fundamentally about power, specifically compelling others to "do our will". War is violence in the service of power: ironically, we miss war's true character if we focus only on its killing to the exclusion of its larger purpose. Consider the parallel with lynching of African-Americans. That too was violence in service of power, here the white power structure; we would miss this political dimension if we construed it only as the killing of one person by others. Holmes takes the heart of war to be killing. He is at one with just war theorists here, and both are right in insisting against the "realist" that war's killing is not in a category all its own, immune from moral appraisal. But to leave things there is to ignore that "killing in war", like "killing in lynching", involves the distinctive type of harm due to its power dimension, one not captured by likening its killing to those we find in ordinary life. Killing aimed at "bending the will of the enemy" (Clausewitz), as in war, or breaking the spirit of a people, as in lynching, might be termed "persuasive harm" which the great historian of war John Keegan has likened to that of torture.[3]

This harkens back to my remark that political pacifists condemn the kind of killing that war involves. They do so in condemning its injustice. But they also condemn its inhumanity, which focuses on the power dimension itself. Here the critique draws on the 18th-century critique of "standing armies", as concentrations of power unanswerable to anyone but themselves. Later political pacifists like Randolph Bourne extend this to the modern state, claiming that its concentration of power gave war an "inexorability" that belied all talk of controlling it -- hence any notions of assessing it in terms of the "ends" it achieved.[4] War is neither an instrument of national interest, as realists would have it, or of ethical purpose, as just war theorists would have it, because war is not an "instrument" of anything at all. This is a radical claim that most people will find unreasonable. Perhaps they will find it more compelling when our Afghanistan war enters its 30th or 40th year.

I offer these suggestions of where discussion might now go mindful of how much discussion is just beginning. Hence none of these concerns should be taken as detracting from Holmes's basic achievement. While war has been around for millennia, one could argue that serious analytical reflection on it only began in spring 1977 with the publication of Walzer's Just and Unjust Wars which started today's robust discussions of just war theory and pacifism. If this seems striking, remember that serious reflection on the justification of slavery only began when that institution was on its last legs -- as, I believe, though it's perhaps not obvious, war is on its last legs.


[1] Michael Walzer, "The Triumph of Just War Theory (and the Dangers of Success)", Social Research, Vol. 69, No. 4.

[2] See my polemic on this matter, The Chickenhawk Syndrome: War, Sacrifice, and Personal Responsibility (Roman and Littlefield, March 2009).

[3] He writes of the American Civil War, "The whole point of the war was to hold mothers, fathers, sisters, and wives in a state of tortured apprehension, waiting for the terrible letter from hospital that spoke of wounds and which all too often presaged the death of a dear son, husband, or father." "Torturing the apprehensions of the non-combatants was a new development in warfare." John Keegan, The American Civil War (Vintage, 2009), p. 318.

[4] Randolph Bourne, War and the Intellectuals: Collected Essays, 1915-1919 (Hacket Publishing, 1999).