Pagans and Philosophers: The Problem of Paganism from Augustine to Leibniz

Placeholder book cover

John Marenbon, Pagans and Philosophers: The Problem of Paganism from Augustine to Leibniz, Princeton University Press, 2015, 354pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691142555.

Reviewed by Brian Copenhaver, The University of California, Los Angeles


This is an excellent book on an important subject conceived in an original way. John Marenbon names his topic in the title, the 'problem of paganism,' and he sets it in the period between Augustine and Leibniz -- the Long Middle Ages. The project lives up to its scope and ambition. Marenbon has written an engaging and compelling history of an intriguing philosophical issue à la longue durée, which for Anglophone philosophers is unusual: most accounts of philosophy's past by contemporary practitioners are micro-stories or nano-stories. This is a macro-story and a superb one.

Marenbon's previous accomplishments help explain why he has done the job so well: not only his expertise on Abelard, Boethius and other medieval thinkers but also his splendid surveys of medieval philosophy as a whole. This experience has equipped him to write history over the long haul and to do it with philosophical depth and grace. As a result, when his analysis uncovers key distinctions -- contrasting one thinker's views with another's, for example -- these positions are not just asserted and described, they are argued, evaluated and made coherent by a narrative. This is the history of philosophy at its best.

All the better because Marenbon's history of philosophy is also cultural history, an approach that deepens our grasp of his topic and invites an audience larger than one might otherwise expect. From a specialist on Boethius and Abelard, readers will be ready to learn about Albert, Aquinas, Bacon, Ockham, Scotus and Suárez -- and learn they will. But they will also hear a great deal, and to good effect, about Boccaccio, Chaucer, Dante, Langland, Wolfram von Eschenbach, the Book of Sir John Mandeville and Matteo Ricci's True Meaning of 'Lord of Heaven.' And Marenbon the reader of poetry, fiction and missionary propaganda gains from Marenbon the philosopher.

The problem of paganism -- the author does not put it this way -- is a special case of a special case of the problem of evil. Why is everything such a mess, and because of that mess, why must good people suffer? When Christians ask the second question about pagans like Aeneas or Socrates, the suffering in question will be eternal damnation and the unrequited goodness will be the excellence of those pagan stalwarts, heroes of the city or of the mind. Calling the heroes 'pagan' labels them as neither Christians nor Jews nor Muslims; they may have lived either before or after Christ came to save all mankind. They may have been Trojans sworn to Aeneas, or maybe they were Incas enslaved by Spain, and if they were ignorant of the true God, their ignorance may have been culpable or not culpable.

As with so much else in medieval thought and religion, Augustine drew the first conspicuous boundaries, which did not stay where he put them. While praising the Platonists for turning him toward Christ, Augustine still judged them to be damned by pride and ignorance -- especially ignorance of the incarnation. Pagans of his own time, when the Church still faced pagan resistance, could never be saved if they stayed outside the faith. Although their ancestors had often been praised as virtuous, those virtues were not real and could not save them. Job was a rare exception: he was not a Jew, and humility made him receptive to God's grace. Augustine's stingy calculus still operated in the age of Descartes, shaping the austere morality of Jansenism, but it was never a winning position.

Most medieval philosophers before Abelard were kinder to their pagan predecessors, if not with an orderly kindness. The enormous influence of the Consolation by Boethius worked on the happier side because he saw philosophy -- unaided by Christian faith -- as going a long way before it failed, perhaps inviting other help to intervene. How such help might arrive interested many readers of Boethius, but from the time of Alcuin through the days of William of Champeaux their speculations yielded little light or pattern. Some early thoughts about pagans became commonplaces in later debates, however: when an early Life of Gregory the Great credited the Pope with a miracle that swept the Emperor Trajan (who persecuted Christians) to salvation, the hagiography was too good to forget.

Abelard knew the Trajan story. With his great genius and demonic energy, he also focused on the larger problem of paganism like no one before him. Anxious to find roles for reason and philosophy in religion, he discussed the ancient philosophers often and extensively. He was sure that many had the basic Christian truth -- or most of it: God exists, One yet Three, administering rewards and punishments to immortal human souls. In a painstaking way, not copying wholesale from a single source, Abelard tracked the transmission of such truths through a line of pagan sages: his was an early model of the prisca theologia or ancient theology, reaching back to Hermes Trismegistus, that Marsilio Ficino made famous centuries later. Marenbon emphasizes, correctly, the origin of this notion -- the Latin version, anyhow -- in Augustine's hostile treatment of Hermes, turned by Abelard into a positive story, ready to be told again by Bacon, Bradwardine, Holcot and other scholastics.

Abelard thought that the Trinity should be obvious to anyone who thinks about God, as many pagans plainly had. As for the incarnation, acceptance of that mystery was absolutely necessary for salvation, and few unbaptized philosophers could have had it revealed to them. Virtue, on the other hand, even exemplary virtue, was not rare at all among the old sages, who devised the scheme of cardinal virtues and practiced them. Could their extraordinary virtue gain the prize of a special revelation, filling out the knowledge required? Could knowledge reinforced by virtue win enough grace from God to save the sages?

By asking such questions persistently and responding with insight, Abelard developed the material that allows Marenbon to locate the problem of paganism under three headings: knowledge, virtue and salvation. Before Christ came, exemplary virtue could have led -- by special arrangement -- to a divine grant of sufficient knowledge to pagan philosophers, the two combining to secure the ultimate prize of salvation. Even after Christ came, a miracle may have saved Trajan, and others could have been candidates for revelations on demand.

Job, not a Greco-Roman pagan but also not a Jew or a Muslim, was an odd case and had always attracted attention. After the thirteenth century, missionaries, merchants and travelers recorded new impressions of first encounters -- with the Mongols, for example -- that stretched the old contours of paganism. Practical motives shaped these fresh reports and shifted their points of view. To convert the heathen or to trade gold for spice, sympathy might lubricate a transaction. Tales spun by imagination, like those about the islands of Bragmey and Gynosophe (read Brahmans and Gymnosophists) in the Book of Sir John Mandeville, disseminated cheery fantasies about likeable pagans.

Another fresh face of paganism, the most persuasive of all, arrived close to home and not attached to a stranger. For centuries Aristotle had been a fixture in Europe's classrooms, though only for his logic. When the rest of his enormous output became available after 1200, his readers built the first universities around those teachings -- artifacts of pagan culture. Pagan wisdom became the curricular heart of Western Christendom. How to handle this troublesome novelty? What did Aristotle really know? Could Heaven have been his reward?

Students and teachers in the new universities had three different responses, which Marenbon calls selective rejection, limited relativism and unity. The first option was to select some of Aristotle's mistakes -- including big mistakes -- for rejection, while accepting the rest of his teaching. The rejections need not have been motivated by religion, and this selectivity plays a smaller role in Marenbon's story than the other two approaches.

Limited relativism appealed to doctrinaire Aristotelians like Siger of Brabant and Boethius of Dacia. Their way was to choose Christian truth where Aristotle contradicts it but to follow the Philosopher elsewhere -- the most vexed doctrines being the immortality of the human soul and divine creation of the world. Boethius of Dacia went farther, insisting that philosophers, speaking ex professo about philosophy, should endorse demonstrated pagan wisdom about such topics even when it offends the faith. After this more aggressive stance provoked the infamous condemnations of 1277, John of Jandun and other 'Averroists' kept going in the same direction.

Aquinas made the third way of unity safer and attractive by stipulating that any philosophizing contrary to faith is a failure, no real philosophy at all, since nothing proved to be true denies the truth itself, which is Christ's truth. With those conditions set, it was possible to follow Aristotle almost everywhere. On the larger problem of paganism, however, Aquinas could not bring most of his successors with him: hopes for human reason were dwindling, no matter the pedigree. One way out was to favor tradition over reason, as Holcot did in his presentation of the ancient theology.

Considered just in relation to the new Aristotelianism -- and to Aristotle himself as the pagan master of them that know -- Marenbon's taxonomy of selective rejection, limited relativism and unity is useful and persuasive. He also applies it helpfully to the larger problem of paganism and its sub-problems of knowledge, virtue and salvation.

Given Aristotle's dominance in the thirteenth century and for some time afterward, it was not in the cards to make a clean distinction between pagan knowledge and pagan Aristotelian knowledge. As for virtues, most university teachers after Aquinas thought that pagans could have acquired them, that their acquired virtues were real but that they were not enough for salvation. Gregory of Rimini, an outlier, echoed Augustine by denying that pagan virtues were any true virtues at all.

Peter Lombard -- always at the center of theological debate -- had insisted on faith in Christ as a requirement for salvation: hence, if pagans were saved, and if they could not have reasoned their way to faith, they must have had it by revelation. For 'elders' like Abraham, this revealed faith was distinct, but for more recent pagans it was veiled. The Lombard's ruling set the standard honored by Aquinas when he accepted implicit faith as covering even Christ's incarnation and passion. Special inspiration was another route. In any case, since God "does not deny grace to those who do what they have in them," there had to be some path to salvation for virtuous pagans.

In Dante's Comedy, nonetheless, Aristotle is not saved; he is condemned by a limited relativism -- in Marenbon's formulation. Il maestro di color che sanno, like Socrates, Plato, Democritus and other ancient sages, is a model of virtue who lacks the theological virtues of faith, hope and charity -- a defect that excludes him from Paradise. Feeling the stress of excellence punished, Dante compensates and innovates by sending Aristotle and his peers to Limbo, previously reserved for biblical patriarchs and unbaptized infants.

Psychologically, Dante's readers are relieved that Aristotle will not roast in Hell. Theologically, they are to accept that he will never see God -- no beatific vision -- and that this loss is the greater punishment. Within the artifice of Dante's theological epic, the accounting is plausible. Plausibility is sometimes strained, however, as the problem of paganism evolves in other contexts.

This is my question, not Marenbon's: if Hell's physical torments are not the most dreadful result of damnation, why bother to spare the virtuous pagans in just this secondary way? Plainly, no one likes the prospect of Aunt Agatha frying for eternity, and the same goes for the Stagirite. But Aristotle and Aunt Agatha without the beatific vision? Deprivation of an abstraction is not so painful to contemplate. The later scholastic tradition on virtuous pagans, tracked in detail by Marenbon, was constructed by virtuosos of abstraction like Melchior Cano, John Mair and Francisco Suárez -- a virtuosity that drew scorn and mockery from Erasmus, Montaigne, and Rabelais.

Sancte Socrates, ora pro nobis: by putting Socrates into the Litany of Saints, Erasmus mocked himself a little in order to praise the philosopher. His delicate irony points toward Montaigne and Descartes, away from Aquinas and Dante. Marenbon, for good and proper reasons, leaves Erasmus out when he examines "thinkers outside the universities" toward the close of his Long Middle Ages, focusing instead on other "writers more influenced by humanism" as counterpoints to "mainstream Catholic theologians." His account of Cusanus, Ficino, More, the two Picos, Pomponazzi, Steuco, Valla and others -- especially their views on concordism, syncretism and the ancient theology -- is well informed and germane.

The story thins out, however. Before saying how, let me recommend Marenbon's rich summaries of European reactions to new experiences of paganism from East Asia (Ricci and the Jesuits) and across the Atlantic (De La Vega, De Léry, Las Casas, Sepúlveda, Vitoria and others). Since not all the missionaries on earth could bring all the newfound heathens into the Christian fold, novel responses to the problem of paganism emerged -- like trying to look at Chinese or Brazilian pagans from their own points of view. That effort would culminate in Montaigne's essay 'Of Cannibals.'

Meanwhile, Thomists defended the Thomist line on pagan virtue against challenges from the via moderna, preparing the way for Suárez. Looking for a way to save invincibly ignorant pagans, the great Jesuit theologian turned to a distinction between faith had 'in promise' and faith had 'in actuality.' Likewise, to rescue an otherwise blameless child from original sin, Cano, a Dominican, zeroed in on the 'first act' of a child reaching the age -- or the moment -- of reason as just the right occasion for obliterating sin instantaneously.

Ingenious distinctions and clever constructions were nothing new in scholastic theology, leaving Erasmus, Luther and their followers cold and ready to conclude that the whole enterprise was vacuous and a blight on religion. Alert to such sentiments, the new Jesuit order that made Aquinas its official theologian conceded, in its charter document, that the mos scholasticus was not the best way to preach or lecture in public. Abstract theorizing, as perfected by Suárez, was absolutely essential for theologians, but it could never reach deep into feelings in order to bring souls to God.

To do that very job -- to make emotional contact with students -- the Society's famous Plan of Studies put Vergil on the curriculum alongside Cicero and Horace. Young boys (like Descartes) would memorize the Aeneid (except the Dido story in book 4) to ingest the heroism of a pagan warrior, pius Aeneas. Boys were nourished on the classics (litterae) to direct them toward pietas, a Christianized version of Roman civic virtus. The basic principle is Erasmian: for educated Christians, good letters (bonae litterae) make good morals.

The educational power of Jesuit classicism, working the mines of pagan virtue, was not a strength of universities staffed by experts like Cano or Suárez. More attention to this weakness in late scholasticism would have improved the last fifth of Marenbon's book. But that would have meant attending to figures, like Erasmus, who are not part of the story as told, and to issues, like Erasmian critiques of late scholasticism, that also go uncovered. Marenbon is aware of what he has not investigated, and his choices are sound -- not just because life is short but also because this excellent book has resulted as much from omissions as from inclusions.

One of Marenbon's aims, well executed, is to tell a story about the Long Middle Ages, which makes the fifteenth century continuous with the fourteenth and thirteenth. But continuity need not be homogeneous. Alcuin's age was not the age of Aquinas: an important fact for Marenbon's story. Likewise, Ficino's century was not the century of Ockham. Marenbon never denies the difference, but the difference is more distinctive for his problem of paganism than a reader will discover from his book.

His decision to eliminate Erasmus goes along with other omissions or light treatments that could be heavier: not much about Lactantius, for example, a Latin writer immersed in Greek literature, nor Clement of Alexandria or Eusebius of Caesarea, who wrote only in Greek. Because Marenbon's initial framework is Augustinian, the Greek Fathers fall away; why Lactantius recedes is harder to say. In any case, the omission of the Greek Fathers, along with Greek Neoplatonism, obscures what is most original in Marsilio Ficino's response to the problem of paganism -- especially the ancient theology, a key part of Marenbon's story and, in its Quattrocento version, a product of Ficino's philological Hellenism, unexampled in the Middle Ages.

Abelard's ancient theology and Holcot's and Bradwardine's are lists of ancient sages made to ground praises of pagan virtues and philosophical skill. Ficino's ancient theology is more ambitious -- a theory of history and a step toward a secular conception of human time. Ficino finds that theological wisdom has flowed in two parallel channels (three, according to Pico), one outside the biblical narrative of salvation history. Happiness in the latter Augustinian story comes only in the New Jerusalem, but Ficino saw himself and his friends in Florence as a circle of Platonic sages who were emulating, there and then, the virtues of the ancient Academy -- Plato's inheritance from Zoroaster and Trismegistus and his legacy to Plotinus and Proclus.

A key piece of evidence came to Ficino by way of a Latin translation, George of Trebizond's version of the Preparation for the Gospel by Eusebius, that transmitted a fragment of Numenius preserved by Eusebius. Eusebius had decreed that every good thought written down by a pagan was stolen from a Hebrew source, but Ficino, an ardent and expert Platonist, could not agree. He read the fragmentary question -- "what is Plato but Moses speaking Greek" -- as authenticating an ancient theology that was very friendly to the old sages: so friendly, in fact, that Ficino could praise Socrates in terms far more extravagant than a line in the Litany of Saints. Using the official vocabulary of fides, spes et charitas, Ficino attributes the three theological virtues to the Socrates of the Apology, reading the speech as a proleptic imitation of Christ that reflects every detail of the passion story in the Gospels.

Ficino's admirers and detractors both used to remember his Academy as a den of neo-paganism. There was no such Academy, however, and Ficino was a priest and a devout Christian. The only real pagan in Quattrocento Italy -- George Gemistos Pletho, a Greek -- had come just to visit, attending the Council of Florence in 1438-39 to be lionized by the Latin literati. Ficino's contemporary, Pomponio Leto, organized a real Academy in Rome. Still, even in the decadent south, Leto and his merry men were not ready for Aubrey Beardsley: they came from good families to pursue curial careers, some destined for high office. They were serious about art and archaeology, but they also liked to wear togas and make up names for each other like Callimachus Experiens: nothing much to it, though some ended up in the Pope's jail.

Just as missionaries to Peru and Japan reacted with empathy to local populations, so these avid students of the classics historicized themselves as make-believe Romans. With Pomponio as their Pontifex Maximus, while addressing contemporary office-holders as patres conscripti, was it wrong to honor Almighty God as Jupiter Optimus Maximus? This was not a thirteenth century question; it was a fifteenth century question. Continuity between the eras did not make them the same era, and more about the difference would have helped Marenbon's story.

In 1499, Aldus Manutius used the defining technology of the new age -- the printing press -- to produce a beautiful book that would have baffled any viewer from the thirteenth century. This Love-Strife in a Dream of Poliphilus is a decorous but secular fantasy with woodcuts meant to transport the viewer into an un-Christian space, a different look at the pagan world that Pomponio and his friends were trying to replicate. There, in that magical little book, Aubrey Beardsley actually was on the horizon, in scenes not only distant but bizarre for medieval eyes.

The Love-Strife was an elitist fantasy, never -- not even now, on the internet -- seen by many people and understood by fewer. For a demotic fantasy -- demotic for us, anyhow -- of greater power and related effect, we have the Adam that Michelangelo painted in Rome a few years after Aldus printed his dream book in Venice. Again, the image is utterly foreign to any medieval sensibility. This first human was not a Jew or a Christian. Was Adam a pagan, then? If so, we are all children of paganism, whose patriarch Michelangelo put on display in all his secular nakedness and glory, leaving the bearded Creator floating alongside as an afterthought. Who really made whom in whose image? And is that image pagan, like the Laocoön or the Apollo Belvedere? Asked about Michelangelo's stunning ceiling, these are post-medieval, perhaps modern questions.

Such questions might move Professor Marenbon to push his inquiry farther, even after achieving so much. He might look past Leibniz and the end of the Long Middle Ages to the later history of philosophy. Kant was aware of a problem of paganism, and his response was something like Abelard's, up to a point: "The moral concept of God [that] reason gives us is so simple and obvious . . . that not much cultivation is required for faith," including even hints of the Trinity in pagan religions. On the other hand, Kant's pagans were not especially virtuous: "the concept of God was so corrupt even among the Greeks and Romans . . . [because] they knew so little of morality."

What about Kant's successors in philosophy? Since some still had a stake in Christianity -- Hegel, Schopenhauer, Nietzsche, Heidegger -- perhaps they also had a stake in paganism. Maybe paganism has ceased to be problematic only in the analytic tradition.