Paleontology: A Philosophical Introduction

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Derek Turner, Paleontology: A Philosophical Introduction, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 227pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521133326.

Reviewed by Alan C. Love, University of Minnesota (Twin Cities)


To call a book a "philosophical introduction" is to invoke at least two different connotations. First, the topic might be well studied but students, both undergraduate and graduate, need a survey of the landscape to help enter into the scholarly conversation. Second, the topic might not have been considered philosophical in the past, and thus the book serves as a portal into the kinds of conceptual issues that arise in the vicinity. In each case there is a justification for the present volume. Having taught an undergraduate course on fossils and philosophy, I can attest to the dearth of material that provides the right balance of examples, clarity, and philosophical depth. Usually it is the first two that are present in general audience books by practicing scientists (e.g., Thomson 2005); sustained reflection on the epistemic peculiarities manifested in historical sciences, and paleontology in particular, is routinely absent (but see Kemp 1999).[1] And it is true that most philosophers have paid scant attention to paleontology; the author's earlier work (Turner 2007) and that of a few others (e.g., Grantham 2007; Parsons 2001; several chapters in Sepkoski and Ruse 2009; Sterelny 1992), stand out as exceptions that prove the rule. But there is a tension between the first and second connotations of "philosophical introduction." If we adopt the first connotation -- that a topic has been well studied and needs to be distilled for a new audience -- then it would suggest that paleontology has been treated philosophically to some degree of sophistication. But this doesn't fit with the relative scarcity of philosophical investigation into paleontology. If we adopt the second connotation -- that a topic has not been treated as particularly philosophical -- then it would be difficult to package succinctly the important themes and currents of thought from past philosophical scholarship on paleontology. These themes have not yet been identified or probed adequately to identify significant distinctions and substantive issues. Before assessing how this tension affects the book, we need to summarize its structure and content.

The present volume is one of the first to emerge from the Cambridge Introductions to Philosophy and Biology series, which targets upper-level undergraduates and graduates studying biology and/or philosophy. The aim of the series is to offer timely discussions of major topics at the junction of philosophy and biology while attending to pedagogical prerequisites, such as brevity and accessibility. The production values are high, with aesthetic investments in cover design and paper quality, as well as ample diagrams for illustration throughout the text. Physically attractive book production is important for classroom use and this volume more than meets the standard.

In terms of the delivery of intellectual content, the book shines with readable prose and smooth transitions. Chapter 1 contains a key distinction between organismic and evolutionary paleontology. Organismic paleontology focuses on the biological characteristics of extinct animals and plants (e.g., their behavior, ecological role, or life history strategy). Evolutionary paleontology concentrates on broad patterns in the fossil record and their evolutionary interpretation (e.g., a trend of increasing size in mammals or the Permian mass extinction), including inferences to the causal processes responsible for the production of the patterns. Turner illustrates each of these and then leaves organismic paleontology aside to unpack aspects of evolutionary paleontology (aka paleobiology) in the remainder of the book.

The justification for the centrality of evolutionary paleontology is that starting in the early 1970s paleobiology was used as a vanguard to challenge key ideas in evolutionary theory (and the lack of a role for paleontology within it). The shape of this challenge is summarized in seven slogans (pp. 7-9): (1) paleontology has more to contribute to biology than to geology; (2) study fossils in bulk -- individual specimens don't tell you much about evolution; (3) paleontology needs theories; (4) if you can't experiment, then simulate; (5) don't assume that the fossil record is incomplete; analyze the incompleteness; (6) resist reductionism; (7) don't shy away from raising big questions about evolution. None of these are exceptionless statements. For example, as Turner acknowledges (though downplays), single fossil specimens can tell you a lot about evolution. The finding of Tiktaalik roseae made a major contribution to our understanding of the origin of limbs from fins in tetrapods (Shubin et al. 2006). One can also worry about the history -- paleontologists did not shy away from the big questions in the mid-twentieth century (Simpson 1961) -- and what it means to say paleontology needs theories (does it not have any? Should it have one? Two? Why?). But the orientation of the book is clear -- "a (mostly) non-partisan guide, with a strong philosophical slant, to some of the big ideas and questions about evolution that came out of the paleobiological revolution" (p. 11).

The book has four main topical components: (a) punctuated equilibrium (chapters 2-3); (b) species selection and the hierarchical expansion of evolutionary theory (chapters 4-5); (c) evolutionary trends in the fossil record (chapters 6-7); and, (d) the meanings and roles of contingency and change in evolution (chapters 8-9). Each of these components contains treatments of focal philosophical questions. For example, punctuated equilibrium offers a reinterpretation of the fossil record in light of Ernst Mayr's peripatric model of speciation (Eldredge and Gould 1972). If small populations of organisms become geographically isolated, then they can undergo rapid genetic change due to inbreeding effects. This can lead to rapid -- 'punctuated' -- speciation (as measured in geological time), followed by periods of stasis -- 'equilibrium' -- after a new species is established (instead of constant gradual change). The rapidity of speciation would mean transitional forms are less likely to become fossilized. Thus, instead of an absence of evidence due to incompleteness in the fossil record, the lack of transitional forms is what you would expect to observe if species origination occurs according to the peripatric model. Additionally, we have an account of why many fossil forms seem relatively stable (in the sense of not changing significantly in morphology) over long periods of geological time. This is a great example of the theory-ladenness of observation; changing the speciation model (or theory) alters how evidence is construed. We move from a lack of evidence for gradual evolutionary change to evidence in favor of punctuated evolutionary change, from a puzzling observational anomaly (morphological stasis) to a tight evidential fit with theoretical expectation. The empirical details and various presentations of punctuated equilibrium are messy, especially regarding how much of a challenge to evolutionary theory they constitute. Turner discusses these issues perspicuously, paving the way for healthy classroom debate, as well as detailing how Kuhn's perspective on paradigms might have influenced the initial presentation of punctuated equilibrium.

Issues of reductionism can be detected in debates over whether macroevolution can be reduced to microevolution (plus time). Punctuated equilibrium raised questions about how microevolutionary models yield different interpretations of macroevolutionary patterns. Species selection poses similar issues. If distinct causal processes operate at different hierarchical levels of organization (e.g., selection occurring at the level of species), then it is problematic to assume that processes at one level are sufficient to account for all evolutionary phenomena (e.g., selection occurring at the level of populations, with species sorting occurring as a mere by-product; see Erwin 2010; Okasha 2006). Turner deftly navigates the variegated landscape here, but it is essential to note that the reductionism being resisted ('macroevolution cannot be reduced to microevolution') is quite distinct from what other philosophers of biology have worried about (Brigandt and Love 2008), and only a few have tried to bridge the gap (e.g., Grantham 2007).[2] Traditional concerns about multiple realization or theory reduction (inter alia) are not in view, and this may mislead students coming to the philosophical theme for the first time.

Another nice example of drawing out conceptual issues is found in Turner's discussion of the reality of trends in the fossil record (chapter 6). Invoking Dennett's treatment of "real patterns" (Dennett 1991), Turner demonstrates how trends can be understood as compressed descriptions of data from the fossil record. Since these descriptions involve decisions about the level of detail to represent, different choices of coarser or finer-grained descriptions of the data can yield different real patterns (or no pattern at all). These choices include the taxonomic level (phylum, family, order), the temporal periods over which to track patterns (shorter or longer, within geological epochs or across them), and the characteristics measured (trilobite eye lens arrangement versus body segments; sauropod neck length versus the ratio of neck length to tail length). Chapter 9 contains a related manifestation of these issues. Assessments of morphological disparity pertain to localized morphospaces that require the selection of several measurable variables, which may or may not be commensurate with those of other morphospaces, thereby complicating broader comparisons across the fossil record.

Other philosophical issues Turner deals with include the different meanings of progress, theological undertones to debates about contingency, and the ontology of species in the context of species selection. A minor complaint is that several of these discussions provide only weak signposts to philosophical literature; directing students to relevant entry points would have been helpful. There are also some controversial claims that warrant further scrutiny.[3] A more global issue relates to philosophical methodology. In chapter 1, Turner distinguishes two approaches: philosophy-first (top-down philosophy of science) and science-first (bottom-up philosophy of science). The former starts with a stock of philosophical questions (What is causation? Are there laws of nature? What counts as a good scientific explanation?) and then answers these questions (in part) through an appeal to concrete examples. The latter, preferred by Turner, starts with a fine-grained analysis of practices and then draws out conceptual issues operating within the science, appealing to stock philosophical issues if/when necessary. While I am sympathetic to Turner's stated orientation, my own sense is that he often exhibits a more top-down, theory-oriented approach, animated by stock philosophical issues, which motivates the setting aside of the less overtly theoretical organismic paleontology. Organismic paleontology is the predominant locus of practice and is filled with a diversity of reasoning that is philosophically intriguing. Here are three critical observations in light of this methodological worry.

First, there are substantive conceptual issues within organismic paleontology that link up to evolutionary paleontology. At the very end of the book, Turner flags the concept of "living fossils" -- groups that remain remarkably stable morphologically over very long periods of time (e.g., horseshoe crabs or cycads) -- and asks whether they are really fossils or if this is simply a metaphor. But the concept of a living fossil applied in the context of organismic paleontology involves questions about how to measure and compare protracted evolutionary stasis across different temporal intervals, different kinds of character variation, and varying rates of morphological change (i.e., evolutionary paleontology issues). A recent study of cycads (Nagalingum et al. 2011) shows that contemporary representatives are relatively young (~12 million years old), while the temporal comparison utilized when designating contemporary cycad lineage members as living fossils is the upper Triassic (>200 million years ago). At one level of abstraction, today's cycads are living fossils; at another they are not. Methodological complexity is at issue here, not metaphor.

Second, there are questions of how different disciplinary resources are utilized to draw inferences in organismic paleontology. A recent fossil find of a gravid plesiosaur provided the first evidence for viviparity (live-birth) in these Mesozoic aquatic reptiles (O'Keefe and Chiappe 2011). This was puzzling since the plesiosaur fossil record is relatively good and viviparity is expected in large, aquatic animals without the skeletal articulation required for terrestrial nesting. The inference involved a combination of paleontology (both taphonomic conditions for the fossil itself and previous finds of viviparity in other extinct aquatic reptiles), systematics (for phylogenetic relationships among the relevant taxa studied), and embryology (to determine the life history stage of bones via ossification completeness).[4] Based on the relatively large size of the single fetus in conjunction with extant ecological analogs (toothed whales), the authors conclude that this group of plesiosaurs had a K-selected life history (birthing single, large progeny), rather than an r-selected strategy (birthing multiple, small progeny) like most other plesiosaurs. This suggests maternal care and social behavioral dynamics, otherwise rare characteristics in related modern reptiles (e.g., snakes). These types of inferences require a subtle interplay of paleontological and neontological models and expectations derived from them (Kemp 1999, ch. 2). One of the most prominent is the inference of function (behavior) from structure (morphology) (Thomason 1995). Another is the inference from fossils to paleoecology -- the structure and dynamics of ancient ecosystems (Dodd and Stanton 1990). The integration (or lack thereof) of these heterogeneous models between disciplines and across timescales to support organismic paleontology hypotheses needs explicit philosophical treatment. Their absence from the book represents a departure from some of Turner's earlier work (e.g., Turner 2000).[5]

Third, there are questions of interdisciplinary interactions in and among evolutionary paleontology projects. Macroevolutionary studies have shown that attending to ecological dimensions is absolutely crucial for postulating well-grounded causal claims about fossil record patterns (Jablonski 2005). These causal claims have to be conceptualized across data points separated by thousands to millions of years. Paleontology and evolutionary developmental biology is another point of intersection, with questions of how discoveries about ontogeny in model organisms relate to patterns of morphological variability in segment number or trends in digital or limb loss (Raff 2007; Hall 2002). Ecology, development, and geochemistry all collide in trying to account for an evolutionary paleontology pattern that puzzled even Darwin more than 150 years ago: the Cambrian Explosion. Here the epistemological burden is so complex that the researchers themselves quite happily acknowledge the conceptual aspects of the task (Erwin et al. 2001; Knoll and Carroll 1999; Marshall 2006).[6] Relevant philosophical issues include the integration of different disciplinary perspectives (especially competing standards for what counts as a good explanation), the degree to which different approaches are competing or complementary, and the subtle interplay of paleontological and neontological models (as noted above).

Overall, Turner successfully distills chunks of paleontology that have been studied by philosophers to date, thereby providing an invaluable teaching resource for introducing students to conceptual issues in paleobiology (especially where Gould staked claims or provoked controversy). This very success sets in relief how many areas of paleontology harbor poignant conceptual issues that have yet to be canvassed, indirectly exposing the work remaining or terra incognita. Turner invokes the geographic metaphor to describe relations between philosophy and science: "Natural science and philosophy are like two countries on a map with a common border that is well-marked in some places, disputed in others, and in still other places completely undefined" (p. 14). He has given students an exemplary tour of some well worked regions of evolutionary paleontology, but philosophers need to get out of the city and head for uncharted regions where paleontological practice (especially organismic paleontology) remains largely unstudied. Contested explanatory boundaries across different sciences, signaled by complex interdisciplinary relations, need to be both discovered and patiently analyzed. Every paleontologist knows that finding the fossils is just the beginning; years of painstaking analysis await them in the lab back home. But discovery is exhilarating, and philosophers should seek it out. Once you are off the map you never know what you'll find.[7]


Brigandt, I., and A.C. Love. 2008. Reductionism in biologyThe Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, ed. E.N. Zalta.

Cleland, C.E. 2002. Methodological and epistemic differences between historical science and experimental science. Philosophy of Science 69:474-496.

Dennett, D.C. 1991. Real patterns. Journal of Philosophy 88:27-51.

Dodd, J.R., and R.J. Stanton. 1990. Paleoecology, Concepts and Applications. 2nd ed. New York: Wiley.

Eldredge, N., and S.J. Gould. 1972. Punctuated equilibria: an alternative to phyletic gradualism. In Models in Paleobiology, ed. T.J.M. Schopf, 82-115. San Francisco: Freeman, Cooper & Co.

Erwin, D.H. 2010. Microevolution and macroevolution are not governed by the same processes. In Contemporary Debates in Philosophy of Biology, eds. F.J. Ayala, and R. Arp, 180-193. Malden, MA: Wiley-Blackwell.

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[1] There are many superb historical treatments of fossils, most notably those from Martin Rudwick (e.g., Rudwick 1985). These are extremely valuable but do not exhibit sustained discussion of various philosophical questions. Interestingly, there are many stellar historical treatments of geology as well (Laudan 1987), but philosophers have paid even less attention to geology than to paleontology (but see Cleland 2002; Kitts 1978; Turner 2007, ch. 8; Forber and Griffiths 2011).

[2] Turner's discussion of emergence is based almost exclusively on Grantham's analysis (Grantham 2007). While not inherently problematic, this doesn't give direction to a student interested in further literature on the philosophical topic.

[3] "To a very large extent, paleontology's status as a science with a serious theoretical contribution to make depends on the fate of species selection" (p. 97). One could argue that this statement is false (species selection is not that pivotal) or that it contains substantive, implicit assumptions (what does it mean to be a "science with a serious theoretical contribution to make"?). Statements like these might be classroom fodder if used in an upper-level course, especially a graduate seminar.

[4] The authors state this inferential structure explicitly: "Multiple lines of evidence indicate that the juvenile specimen is an in situ fetus. . . . The above taphonomic, taxonomic, and ontogenetic evidence establishes that the adult was a gravid female containing a fetus" (O'Keefe and Chiappe 2011, pp. 870-1).

[5] Turner touches on these issues when noting different views of what counts as a species between population biology and paleontology (pp. 49ff) or the importance of the stem group/crown group distinction from cladistics (pp. 190ff), but they are not the targets of his analysis.

[6] E.g., "developing a coherent explanation for the Cambrian 'explosion' faces several challenges . . . most workers interested in the Cambrian 'explosion' approach the problem through their primary discipline(s) of activity, whether that be paleontology, geology, geochemistry, ecology, climate modeling, developmental biology, etc. Thus, developing a balanced multidisciplinary explanation is at the outset handicapped; the phenomenology and conceptual apparati needed to understand the problem are very rich. This difficulty is exacerbated by the fact that different subdisciplines use different approaches . . . All of these factors must have played a role, but how important was each? To what extent did the Cambrian 'explosion' flow from an interaction between them? How might we develop a conceptual framework for understanding that interaction?" (Marshall 2006, p. 356).

[7] I am grateful to Doug Erwin, Tom Kemp, Lance Lugar, and Derek Turner for constructive feedback on an earlier version of this review.