Panpsychism: Contemporary Perspectives

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Godehard Bruntrup and Ludwig Jaskolla (eds.), Panpsychism: Contemporary Perspectives, Oxford University Press, 2017, 414pp., $78.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199359943.

Reviewed by Joseph Levine, University of Massachusetts Amherst


When I was interviewing for my first tenure-track job, at Boston University, in the winter of 1981, I gave a paper on the problem qualia posed for materialism. In the paper I argued that functionalism, the then (and still) reigning theory on the mind-body relation, couldn't adequately account for qualia. In the question period, Abner Shimony, the renowned philosopher of physics, asked me the following question: what if we attribute consciousness to elementary particles? Wouldn't that help solve the problem? My initial response was the proverbial "incredulous stare." But this was a job interview, so more was required; after all, you don't want to offend a senior member of the department interviewing you. I don't remember exactly what I said in response, but it seems to me that it was a version of the so-called "combination problem" that so exercises many of the contributors to this volume. I believe I expressed puzzlement over how attributing consciousness to fundamental physical entities could help explain my consciousness. I don't remember how, or even if he responded. (I got the job, by the way.)

So 36 years later panpsychists are still dealing with the incredulous stare and the combination problem. The volume under review, with sixteen papers (two by the same author, David Chalmers) divided into four parts, preceded by a helpful introduction by the editors, tries to address both, along with a number of other issues. Part I, "The Logical Place of Panpsychism," contains papers by Chalmers and by one of the editors, Godehard Bruntrup. Part II, "The Variety of Panpsychist Ontologies," contains papers by Galen Strawson, Yujin Nagasawa and Khai Wager, Berit Brogaard, and Gregg Rosenberg. Part III, "Panpsychism and the Combination Problem," will occupy most of my attention here. It contains papers by David Chalmers, Barbara Montero, William Seager, Sam Coleman, and Philip Goff. Finally, Part IV, "Panpsychism and Its Alternatives," contains papers by Brian McLaughlin, Achim Stephan, Leopold Stubenberg, Charles Taliaferro, and Uwe Meixner.

The first two papers explore the logical space surrounding panpsychism and do a very good job of presenting the general geography of the issues, while defending opposing positions on a major divide in panpsychist theory: between constitutive and non-constitutive panpsychism. To see what's going on here, let me back up and present the main outlines of the case for panpsychism. In the process, I hope to mitigate the incredulous stare, or, at least, stare back.

To begin, we must start with the rejection of traditional reductive physicalism about phenomenal consciousness (or conscious experience, or qualia, or whatever we call it these days). The only paper in the volume to actually defend reductive physicalism is the one by McLaughlin[1], where he opts for the view that whatever epistemic gap there may be between descriptions of physical states and descriptions of conscious states, this does not signal a metaphysical gap. I won't discuss this option further here, as there is more than enough literature that deals with reductive physicalist responses to the explanatory gap. But what is reductive physicalism, as I use the term, and what is entailed by rejecting it?

In the sense I intend here, reductive physicalism is the doctrine that mental phenomena (by which I mean phenomenally conscious phenomena, let that be understood for the rest of the review) are realized by, grounded in, or constituted by non-mental phenomena. (I will use the terms "realization," "grounding," and "constitution" interchangeably here.) The standard example is functionalism, according to which mental phenomena are identified with causal or functional roles that are played by various physical states and properties. One of the crucial features of realization is that the realizer metaphysically necessitates the realized (or, put differently, what's realized metaphysically supervenes on the realizer). Most challenges to physicalism, especially those that proceed via conceivability considerations, attack this necessitation relation that supposedly holds between the physical (or non-mental, to get around problems about defining "physical") and the mental. So what do we conclude about the nature and distribution of phenomenal consciousness if it isn't necessitated by certain physical configurations?

There seem to be just a few choices (all nicely taxonomized in the Chalmers pieces). Now, one way to put the claim that phenomenal consciousness is not realized by non-mental phenomena is to say that it is "basic" or "fundamental" in nature. One option here is what many authors in the volume call "strong emergence." This is the claim that at certain levels of aggregation and organization of physical systems consciousness just sort of pops into being, or, as we say, emerges. That such systems possess consciousness would be a basic law of nature -- i.e. not realized by other, lower-level laws -- however it wouldn't involve fundamental elements of nature, but rather large systems. The other option is to somehow build consciousness (or phenomenal properties) into the lowest levels of nature, thus endowing whatever entities science settles on as the most fundamental entities in nature -- whether they be particles, fields, or space-time itself -- with consciousness. This is, of course, panpsychism.

Chalmers defines "panpsychism" as "the thesis that some microphysical entities are conscious." The first choice, then, that one has to make once one rejects the claim that phenomenal properties are realized and instead are basic, is between panpsychism and strong emergentism. On the latter doctrine, only very complex physical systems possess phenomenal consciousness, though it is instantiated in them as a fundamental, basic property. Faced with the incredulous stare that attends the claim that, say, electrons are conscious, why not opt for emergentism? Strawson (among others in the volume) address this question squarely. According to him, it is pretty much a self-evident principle (which trumps an incredulous stare) that from nothing, nothing comes; or, as he puts it, "there are no absolute or radical qualitative discontinuities in nature," from which he derives the claim that "the experiential . . . can't emerge from the wholly and utterly nonexperiential . . . " (page 82). What makes a discontinuity a "radical qualitative" one is left unexplicated, but I suppose going from the nonexperiential to the experiential would count if anything does.

I will return to the question of emergence below, but for now it's pretty clear what the case for panpsychism is, and how its adherents can respond to the incredulous stare. First, you provide strong reasons of the sort with which we're all familiar for denying that consciousness is realized in physical (non-mental) systems. Second, you appeal to the "no radical emergence in nature" principle. From these two premises, panpsychism seems to follow. If panpsychism seems crazy, well, denying either of the two premises is even crazier -- or, at least, not so obviously less crazy. Consciousness has to be grounded somewhere, and if not in basic laws applying only to complex physical systems, then it must be at nature's base.

There is another argument for panpsychism, derived from Russell, which a number of the authors mention. If we consider the fundamental properties posited by physical science, they all seem relational or dispositional. What is negative charge, say? Well, it's that property such that its bearer repels things with negative charge and attracts things with positive charge. Unless you allow dispositions all the way down, as some do, but many find almost incoherent, then there need to be some intrinsic properties to serve as the categorical bases for these fundamental physical dispositions. But what truly intrinsic properties do we know of in nature? Why, phenomenal properties, of course. So why not kill two birds with one stone? We need to locate phenomenal properties somewhere, and we need some genuinely intrinsic properties to serve as the categorical bases of the fundamental physical properties, so let's put the phenomenal properties right there where they can do some metaphysical work.

One problem I have long had with this idea is that in standard, non-fundamental cases, we look to the features of the categorical bases to explain the dispositions they underlie. So, if being H2O is the categorical basis of water's disposition to freeze at 00 C., then we expect we can explain why water freezes at that temperature by appeal to this underlying molecular structure (along with other facts of course). But is being reddish going to explain why one thing attracts another as opposed to repelling it? Chalmers does mention in this regard that we would expect there to be some structural similarity between the relevant dispositions and their phenomenal bases. So, if the physical property is scalar, so too should be the underlying phenomenal property. But this doesn't fully address the issue. I'll leave it at that.

So, suppose we opt for panpsychism -- the fundamental entities of nature (or some of them, I won't bother about this point) possess consciousness. How then do we understand the relation between the "micro-phenomenal properties" (as Chalmers dubs them) and the macro-phenomenal ones? Here the basic choice is between constitutive panpsychism and non-constitutive panpsychism. On the former view, the macro-phenomenal properties -- such as those instantiated by human beings -- are realized by the micro-phenomenal ones. It's essentially the same relation that holds between macro-physical properties and micro-physical ones. On the non-constitutive view, there is an element of emergence. When certain configurations of micro-phenomenal properties occur, there is a basic law that applies and by which the relevant macro-phenomenal property is instantiated.

Chalmers argues for the constitutive version and Bruntrup for the non-constitutive one. The principal advantage of the former is that it helps with mental causation (that is, the causal relevance of the macro-phenomenal). But the problem is that it exacerbates the so-called combination problem. The non-constitutive version is less bothered by the combination problem, but it threatens epiphenomenalism for the macro-phenomenal properties, and also seems to involve the kind of emergence that panpsychists supposedly seek to avoid. It's supposedly better off than non-panpsychist emergentism since panpsychist emergence doesn't involve the kind of "radical qualitative" jump from the non-experiential to the experiential that the non-panpsychist version does. It's very hard to assess how much of a difference this makes.

Finally, on to the combination problem. As becomes clear in Part III, there are really two combination problems: there is the quality combination problem and the subject combination problem. (There are ways of breaking down the problem into many more, as Chalmers does, but I will ignore that here.) On the assumption that elementary particles are subjects of experience, how is it that aggregating a number of them together comes to constitute a new subject of experience (the subject problem)? Also, given that each micro-subject possesses its own collection (or maybe just one) of phenomenal properties, how do these all come to constitute the phenomenal properties of the macro-subject?

The threshold for answering these questions is quite high for constitutive panpsychism since in order to establish that properties A1-An realize properties B1-Bn, it's necessary to show that it's inconceivable that the former be instantiated without the latter being instantiated. Of course, many philosophers challenge the conceivability-possibility connection on which this requirement depends, but, as Chalmers emphasizes, this is not a response available to most panpsychists. After all, they tend to reject standard physicalism precisely on the grounds that zombies are conceivable. So, isn't that a problem for the panpsychist as well? Couldn't there be "panpsychist zombies"?

Montero argues that there really is no combination problem, or that it isn't particularly troubling. She argues that:

panpsychists should understand the combination of micro-minds . . . in line with the relations we find in the world between higher and lower levels of organization: the relationship between micro-minds and macro-human-level minds is analogous to the relation between atoms and molecules, or macromolecules and organelles, or even populations and communities" (page 216).

But, of course, the standard anti-physicalist conceivability argument starts from the premise that the relations between lower levels of organization and higher ones in the physical world, of the sort she cites, support the conceptual necessitation that seems missing from the body-mind connection, which is why they turn to panpsychism in the first place.

In the end, Montero admits that she doesn't share the standard conceivability reasons for rejecting physicalism, and so is not particularly bothered by the conceivability of panpsychist zombies. So why prefer panpsychism to standard physicalism? She argues that even if panpsychist zombies are conceivable, still it is easier to see how a macro-subject could be necessitated by a collection of micro-entities (organized in the right way, of course) if we start with micro-entities that are experiential, rather than those that are not. While she is talking about a metaphysical necessitation relation here, I assume, and not a nomological one, this consideration echoes the argument for panpsychist emergentism over straight emergentism described above.

Seager appeals to what he calls "combinatorial infusion" to solve the problem. The idea is that we shouldn't think of the way micro-mental-entities combine to form macro ones on the model of a structure built out of the micro-entities, but rather in terms of a new macro-state that ". . . infuses its precursors, or, to use Whitehead's term, substitutes a new state for the set of precursor states" (page 238).

Of course, as Seager admits, this requires introduction of new laws that govern the micro-mental-entities such that from their organization and these laws it just follows that there will be a macro-subject. Is this position vulnerable to the panpsychist zombie objection? Only, argues Seager, if you ignore the new laws. After all, if you leave out the relevant laws of physics and chemistry, you also cannot derive that combinations of two hydrogen molecules and one oxygen molecule will result in water, with its characteristic behavior. But couldn't we make the radical emergentist into a constitutivist by just positing basic psycho-physical laws that hold of micro-physical entities as well? The law that says that when you get such-and-such a complex physical configuration then you get a conscious subject can be couched as a law that governs all of the simple elements constituting the relevant configuration. This threatens to make constitutivity too cheap.

There are two issues here. The first is whether or not the radical emergentist can get around the objections to radical emergence this way, by claiming that the laws apply to the basic, non-mental elements. The second is whether or not appealing to the kinds of laws Seager has in mind for combinatorial infusion allow for a constitutivity claim in the way that the physical laws that take you from being H2O to the macro-properties of water do. On the first score, I suppose one can say that Seager's laws do not relate the non-experiential to the experiential, so therefore don't involve the kind of violation of the anti-emergence principle that the basic psycho-physical laws of the radical emergentist do. (But does this apply to so-called "panprotopsychists"? I'll return to this below.)

However, I think one can distinguish between the kinds of laws that govern H2O molecules to yield the macro-properties of water and the kind of combinatorial infusion law that supposedly yields macro-phenomenal properties from combinations of micro-phenomenal properties. Take the property of being liquid at room temperature. We want to say that this property is realized by (grounded in) the various properties of the molecules and the laws governing their behavior. The way you then justify an a priori entailment thesis -- required by the claim, discussed above, that realization, or constitution, entails an a priori entailment from descriptions of the micro to descriptions of the macro – is, for example, to identify liquidity (a priori) with some functional/causal role property from which it follows that sufficiently large aggregations of H2O molecules exhibit this macro-property. But I don't see how this would work for combinatorial infusion laws. What sort of identity claim of the macro-property would support such an inference? Of course, you can just attribute to the micro-phenomenal properties the disposition to infuse in this particular way, but that seems a cheat. The kinds of physical laws governing H2O molecules that are needed to yield the relevant inference for water really govern their purely micro-behaviors.

Sam Coleman, in what I found the most interesting paper in the volume, takes a divide-and-conquer approach to the problem. When it comes to subjects, he argues, persuasively to my mind, that no solution to the combination problem is workable. However, he does hold that it can be solved for phenomenal qualities, and thus supports a position called "panqualityism". The idea is that micro-entities instantiate the qualities, but are not themselves subjects of experience. When they get together into various configurations, the wholes they constitute then possess certain qualities constituted by the collection of micro-qualities.

Whether this position works depends on two things: first, a reasonable account of (macro)subjectivity, and, second, whether he really can show that his panqualityism doesn't involve a worrisome emergence. I'll come back to the first problem. Coleman spends a lot of time arguing that he can make sense of combination of qualities without introducing emergence, but I don't see that he really addresses the conceivability argument as it affects panpsychism. Most of his discussion attempts to mitigate whatever obstacles to quality combination are discussed in the literature, but little about how, even if one could see how it's possible for there to be quality combination, it could be (conceptually) necessary. This, remember, is the threshold for those who use conceivability considerations against straight physicalism. I suppose in the end he would appeal to special laws in the way Seager does, but then his position would be vulnerable to the same objection just discussed above.

The first problem is how to construct a subject, an entity that is aware of the various phenomenal qualities. Coleman here adopts a higher-order view of subjective awareness. This is a version of functionalism, and so faces no combinatorial problem as awareness is identified with a specific causal role, one involving representational states. Of course, anyone who would take panpsychism seriously is usually motivated by the standard anti-physicalist arguments, and these would certainly apply to higher-order theory. But Coleman argues that while the zombie, or conceivability, argument works for phenomenal qualities -- hence the need to posit them as fundamental entities -- it doesn't work for awareness. The reason is that in order for the "toggle" (as he puts it) between zombie and conscious person to work in our conception (while keeping physical constitution constant), it's necessary that there be a phenomenal property involved. But awareness doesn't entail any specific phenomenal property in its own right, over and above the phenomenal properties of which one is aware. Hence the zombie argument doesn't get a grip here. It's a clever argument, but I don't really see the justification for the claim that we need a phenomenal property in order to get the argument going. It seems pretty clear to me that I can conceive of a creature that instantiates some macro-quality without being aware of it. Of course, if you claim that instantiating the qualities by itself entails awareness of them, then Coleman can't make the claims about the micro-entities he wants to make.

After reading through all of these papers -- and obviously I have not dealt with everything of interest in them -- I am left with three concerns about panpsychism. The first is a general worry that, I believe, underlies most of the incredulous stare responses to the doctrine. When claiming that experiential (or qualitative) properties are instantiated in elementary particles -- or fields, or even the cosmos as a whole -- what do we really mean? We have no conception, it seems to me, of what this consists in. One way of getting at the problem is that, since we have almost no conception of what this would be, it seems to allow too much room for speculation of all kinds, without enough constraints on theorizing. It would be nice to know how to limit the degrees of freedom in the doctrine. As I say, this is a fairly general, and non-specific worry, and I don't claim that it undermines the positive arguments for the doctrine. Indeed, as someone who rejects standard physicalist accounts of conscious experience myself, I take the short argument for panpsychism presented at the beginning of this review seriously.

The second concern in a way follows from the first. Before seriously entertaining panpsychism, I held a version of strong emergentism. I believed there were basic laws (of nature, in a suitably broad sense of that term) that related certain complex systems with conscious experience. The nomological base for conscious experience I thought of as the informational features of a system, along the lines discussed by Chalmers (1996) -- more on this presently. But now, rather than being totally convinced by the claims of "no radical emergence," I've rather begun to wonder whether there really is any difference between the sort of radical emergence I have supported and the kind of panpsychist emergence defended by some in this volume.

After all, let's call the sort of psycho-physical law that I held (or still hold, who knows?) must exist the Fundamental Psycho-Physical Law (the FPPL). Suppose it relates complex systems like human brains and conscious experiences. Then, as mentioned above, can't one say that this is a law that holds of elementary particles when they get into systems of this sort? Can't we say that, therefore, there must be some property instantiated by the elementary particles by virtue of which, when they are organized in a certain way, they contribute to the production of conscious experience? So, the difference between panpsychicst emergence and straight emergence seems unclear. This is especially the case with what Chalmers calls "panprotopsychism," the doctrine that fundamental entities do not instantiate phenomenal properties, but rather "proto-phenomenal" properties. What is a proto-phenomenal property if not something that disposes the object in question, when organized with others in the appropriate way, to yield genuine phenomenal experience? So, I wonder: if I hold there is such a law as FPPL, do I now count almost automatically as at least a panprotopsychist, if not a panpsychist? I'm okay with that.

Finally, I want to return to the combination problem. Chalmers, in his second contribution, presents a lot of difficulties for panpsychism under that rubric, and one I haven't discussed so far is what he calls the "structural mismatch" problem. If macro-phenomenal properties are realized in micro-phenomenal properties, and micro-phenomenal properties are instantiated in micro-physical properties (indeed, on the Russellian version, they constitute the categorical bases of the micro-physical properties), then one would expect an isomorphism between the structure of the relevant macro-physical properties and the quality spaces of the relevant macro-phenomenal properties. But what reason is there to think such an isomorphism exists? It certainly doesn't seem that there is.

Now some contributors to the volume argue there is reason to expect this (Rosenberg in particular), and appeal to the work that informational structure can do. This also brings to mind the speculation from Chalmers (1996) mentioned above. But here is my concern. It seems pretty clear that the fine-tuned structure of phenomenal experience -- especially if you believe in cognitive phenomenology, which is gaining adherents recently (see Bayne and Montague 2011) -- is largely predicted by the kinds of information processing states attributed to the mind, including unconscious ones, by cognitive science. While this may seem favorable to those who want to base the phenomenology-physical system structural isomorphism on the notion of informational structure, I think we are talking about two different notions here. There is an internal kind of informational structure determined by the causal structure of the brain, its parts, and their parts. This is the kind of informational structure that I believe is relevant to Tononi's (2012) theory of "integrated information." But the informational structure attributed by cognitive science is determined not by the compositional structure of the brain, but by the representational contents attributed to mental faculties. Think of it this way. The brain represents a world with a certain structure, and the structure of that represented world predicts, or even constitutes, the structure of experience. Perhaps there is reason to expect these two structures -- the structure of the represented world and the internal structure of the representational vehicles that represent it -- to be isomorphic, but I don't see, at least without further argument, why.

I highly recommend this volume to anyone who wants to get the lay of the land concerning panpsychism. Despite the length of this review, I didn't discuss everything of interest in it. Many will come away staring as incredulously as they did from the beginning, but others, perhaps convinced by the need to consider all options seriously, will find themselves educated, if not convinced.[2]


Bayne, T. and Montague, M. eds. (2011). Cognitive Phenomenology, Oxford University Press.

Chalmers, D. (1996). The Conscious Mind: In Search of a Fundamental Theory, Oxford University Press.

Tononi, G. (2012). PHI: A Voyage from the Brain to the Soul, Pantheon Books.

[1] Actually, McLaughlin would characterize his position as "non-reductive" physicalism. But as I define the term "reductive physicalism" below (to distinguish it from the kind of physicalism panpsychists might embrace), it applies to McLaughlin's position.

[2] I want to thank Haoying Liu for very helpful comments on an earlier draft.