Paradox and Paraconsistency: Conflict Resolution in the Abstract Sciences

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Woods, John, Paradox and Paraconsistency: Conflict Resolution in the Abstract Sciences, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 380pp, $26.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521009340.

Reviewed by JC Beall , University of Connecticut and David Ripley, University of North Carolina, Chapel Hill


When physicists disagree as to whose theory is right, they can (if we radically idealize) form an experiment whose results will settle the difference. When logicians disagree, there seems to be no possibility of resolution in this manner. In Paradox and Paraconsistency John Woods presents a picture of disagreement among logicians, mathematicians, and other “abstract scientists” and points to some methods for resolving such disagreement. Our review begins with (very) short sketches of the chapters. Following the sketches, we respond to a few of Woods’ arguments.

Chapter Sketches

In Chapter 1, Woods outlines what he takes conflict in abstract sciences — sciences that do not make use of empirical results — to be. He claims that there are only two ways to decide an argument in the abstract sciences that can be effective: cost-benefit considerations and the “method of analytic intuitions”. The former is common (witness David Lewis’s cost-benefit arguments for modal realism); the latter, in effect, amounts to conceptual analysis.

In Chapter 2, Woods presents and rebuts Quine’s arguments against quantified modal logic and then turns to the arguments of relevant logicians against the Lewis-Langford “proof” of ex falso quodlibet, claiming that such logicians have largely begged the question against ex falso.

In Chapter 3, Woods presents one possible strategy for conflict resolution: Reconciliation, or ambiguation. The strategy is this: discover a distinction that shows that there was never a disagreement to begin with; each side was talking about something different. Woods distinguishes argument, inference, and implication, and claims that paraconsistent logicians draw their intuitions from argument and inference only and so should not expect implication (the chief concern of logic, according to Woods) to be paraconsistent.

In Chapter 4, Woods outlines what he takes intuitions to be and what role they play in argument about abstract sciences. He uses Frege and Russell as examples of philosophers who have dealt with abstract conflict (in particular, the Russell set) in different ways — for Frege, says Woods, the Russell set ended set theory, while for Russell it modified set theory.

In Chapter 5, Woods sketches the present state of dialetheic set theory and semantics, as well as the differences between truth-value gluts and truth-value gaps. He argues that, as far as intuitions go, the dialetheist and the non-dialetheist, in argument, must beg the question against each other. However, since the dialetheist opposes tradition, the burden of proof rests firmly on her shoulders, and so dialetheism is defeated. We briefly address this issue below.

In Chapter 6, Woods explores whether fiction might provide some motivation for dialetheism beyond what has already been offered. He analyzes fiction and fictional truth in ways that draw on his earlier work (1974) but that are significantly updated. For example, here he deals with the possibility of inconsistent but non-trivial fiction. In the end, however, he concludes that fiction provides no motivation for dialetheism. We briefly comment on Woods’ discussion of fictionalism about the abstract sciences below.

In Chapter 7, Woods presents his responses to the semantic paradoxes. These are, to our knowledge, new responses and are discussed in more detail below. Woods concludes that, in fact, no contradiction is derivable from Liar and Liar-like sentences or from Curry sentences (although, for reasons we discuss below, the support for his conclusion remains unclear to us).

In Chapter 8, he discusses normativity. He claims that there are certain conditions that must be met for something to be an inference and that beyond those, there are conditions for its being a good inference. He develops this view by analogy with sentences. He also discusses the method of analytic intuitions as it applies to normative claims.

Dialetheists Versus Non-Dialetheists

Dialetheists accept that the negation of some true sentence is true. Non-dialetheists reject that. (Contemporary philosophy is populated by a few more non-dialetheists than dialetheists.) Woods argues that, short of cost-benefit considerations (regarding which, he claims, the jury is still out), the only way to resolve a debate (about dialetheism) between dialetheists and non-dialetheists is via burden of proof. Conceptual analysis, Woods argues, comes up empty — ultimately stalemate.

On whom does the burden of proof rest? Woods’ answer: On the one who bucks tradition to a greater degree. Suppose that that is right. Another question emerges: Who bucks tradition to a greater degree? Woods’ answer: Dialetheists, clearly.

We think that that is too quick. After all, precisely what tradition does dialetheism buck? Perhaps the best answer is that dialetheism bucks classical logic; and it does. But how much weight does that carry?

By our lights, the weight of a traditional theory ought to be heavy only if the evidence is correspondingly so — only if tradition is well-founded. What is the evidence for classical logic? What, that is, is the evidence that classical logic is the correct theory of our logical particles? (One might invoke mathematics, which, in its standard and widespread guise, is certainly classically based; however, mathematics is also “spoken” in an artificial language — a meager one that none the less yields extraordinary results. The relevant concern, however, is natural language — with all its pimples and palpable lack of mathematical precision.) By “conceptual analysis” one’s intuitions strongly point towards classical negation, conjunction, and so on. (Conditionals may not fare so well, but we ignore those here.) Indeed, such “analysis” of our intuitions yields many classical principles, including that no sentence is (or even could be) both true and false. Is that not enough evidence for the classical tradition?

Such “evidence” for classical logic — and, in particular, the “law” of non-contradiction — would be strong were it not for one fairly conspicuous feature of their formation: they were formed on the basis of normal cases. Suppose that you are set the task of formulating logical “laws” (or principles, etc.) governing English. You put together a committee of competent speakers. The principle of non-contradiction is advanced for consideration. After a few minutes, everybody agrees that they cannot so much as imagine a counterexample to that principle. Everyone agrees: “Our intuitions are firmly for that principle: no truth could have a true negation.” But then a priest named ‘Eubulides’ enters the room. Seeing your principle on the board, he modestly asks whether there mightn’t be a sentence that says of itself only that it is false. You reply: “No, there could be no such sentence.” Eubulides replies: “But what I am now saying is false.”

What would be the reasonable response to Eubulides? At the very least, the committee should recognize that their “intuitions”, while probably accurate as far they go, simply did not go far enough; such intuitions were formed on the basis of normal sentences, not the sort of sentence to which Eubulides pointed. If, as we think, that is the correct account of our intuitions on which classical logic is based, then such intuitions are based on an inadequate diet — or at least an incomplete one. And if that is correct, then invoking the “tradition” behind classical logic does very (very) little towards establishing burden of proof.

What tradition, then, does the dialetheist buck to a greater degree than the non-dialetheist? She bucks classical logic, to be sure; but we have already covered that — it is insufficiently supported by intuitions (given that such intuitions were formed via ignoring important prima facie counterexamples), and so insufficiently supported. Unfortunately, we do not know of a well-founded tradition that the dialetheist bucks to a greater degree than the non-dialetheist. Pending discovery of such a tradition, we conclude, pace Woods, that the burden of proof does not rest with the dialetheist.

Interestingly, it may well be the non-dialetheist who bucks tradition to a greater degree than the dialetheist. Which tradition? Not classical logic, of course, but rather philosophical inquiry itself. Tradition has it that philosophers aim to question foundational principles as far as reasonable inquiry may go. (Of course, even that principle is up for examination.) That, in the end, is precisely what dialetheists have done: namely, the traditional philosophical chore of examining foundational principles — in this case, non-contradiction. So far, dialetheists have discovered that inconsistent but non-trivial theories have a lot going for them, at least qua models of our naïve theories (of truth, reference, etc). But so far, non-dialetheists have yet to evince any philosophically or rationally bad features of such (dialetheic) theories, and yet the non-dialetheist continues to claim that tradition is on her side. While we in no way wish to put much stock in this observation, we do think it is worth noting that the dialetheist seems to have an important tradition on her side — the heart of philosophical inquiry, as it were. But we will leave that observation there. As above, Woods’ chief case for tradition (with respect to non-contradiction) is true but irrelevant; tradition dictates burden of proof only if it is well-founded, and in the case of non-contradiction the well-foundedness is (at best) unclear.

Fictionalism and Stipulationism

In Chapter 6, Woods discusses fiction and whether it can provide intuitive motivation for the dialetheist. Near the end of the chapter, he also discusses fictionalism about abstract sciences, preferring to replace it with what he calls stipulationism. Fictionalism, taken as the thesis that the truths of some theory are “secured and validated by analogy with how the truths of fiction themselves are secured and validated” (196), is unattractive for the simple reason that there is no clean explanation of how the truths of fiction are to be treated, especially when they conflict with truths about the world.

In place of fictionalism, Woods presents stipulationism, the thesis that stipulated truth is one kind of truth, in particular, what Woods calls a “hyphenated truth” (221), one that is true-in-system-S, but may be untrue-in-system-S*. For example, the law of excluded middle is true-in-classical-logic, but untrue-in-K3 (or “strong Kleene”). If we use a system for long enough, Woods claims, we forget that its truths are hyphenated. He looks at the example of ZF set theory. When it first arose, it was counterintuitive enough to require hyphenation; nobody confused truths-in-ZF with truths about sets. But naïve set theory had enough problems, or so people thought, to make ZF an attractive replacement. As time passed and ZF became an accepted theory, people lost track of the hyphens. As Woods says:

It is a powerful dynamic. Stipulated truths are hyphenated truths. If, as sometimes happens, these become received truths, those who see them so fail to see their hyphens: in fact, fail to see their hyphens even if they are made aware of the received theory’s stipulative origins (221).

If we use a theory for long enough, we are likely to confuse its hyphenated truths with truths simpliciter, not from any dishonesty, but from our innate preference for adopting the realist stance.

We endorse this claim, and with it what Woods calls benign pluralism: the acceptance of many hyphenated truths. Disjunctive syllogism is valid-in-classical-logic and invalid-in-LP; there is no need to abandon these hyphens, even if we are naturally inclined to do so.

Woods on the Liar

A typical Liar sentence appears to assert of itself only that it is false (or untrue). How can the sentence refer to itself? There seem to be at least three options: i) by name; ii) by indexical; iii) by description. Examples of the three sorts of Liar-like sentences are

(1) (1) is false.
(2) This sentence is false.
(3) The third-displayed sentence in the section labeled ‘Woods on the Liar’ in Beall and Ripley’s review of Paradox and Paraconsistency is false.

Woods takes the classic presentation of the Liar to be something of type i). He dubs the following construction ‘L’:

(1) (1) is false.

As Woods rightly points out (246-248), L is itself a baptism, and thus not itself paradoxical; it is not the sort of thing that can easily be called either true or false. What is paradoxical is the sentence — namely, (1) — that L baptizes. (1) seems paradoxical because of the following argument, which uses only disquotation, quotation (its converse), and substitution of identicals ((1) = ‘(1) is false’) (248-249):

(a) Suppose (1) is true.
(b) ‘(1) is false’ is true, by substitution in (a).
(c) (1) is false, by disquotation on (b).
(d) Suppose (1) is false.
(e) ‘(1) is false’ is true, by quotation on (d).
(f) (1) is true, by substitution in (e).

It is clear that this argument depends heavily on disquotation. What is disquotation exactly? Woods never tells us what he takes the answer to be. He does give us some evidence, however. He tells us (251) that we can move correctly from

‘The cat is on the mat’ is true


The cat is on the mat

by disquoting. So it seems that some sort of standard disquotation is at play. We take the following to be a standard definition of disquotational truth:

For truth to be disquotational is for it to license the following inferences, where ‘p’ is a sentence and ‘ ‘p’ ‘ a name of ‘p’:
(DT1) ‘p’ is true / p
(DT2) p / ‘p’ is true

Certainly, the above inference (regarding the cat) conforms to this definition, in particular (DT1); however, not all of Woods’ claims about disquotation so conform. He claims that if truth is disquotational, the inference from

(1) is true



is licensed (251-252). But this inference is not of the form licensed by (DT1) or (DT2). It is rather of the form

(MT) α is true / α,

where ‘α’ is a name — and that, nota bene, makes no sense. ‘(1)’ is the name of a sentence; we cannot conclude a name. (In fact, so long as nothing is simultaneously a sentence and a name of a sentence, (MT) will always fail to make sense.) Woods sees that this is a problem, although he sees it as a problem for disquotational truth, as defined above. Suppose, for example, that ‘9’ names the sentence ‘The cat is on the mat’. Woods claims (253) that the sentence

9 is true

is in fact oblique; it somehow stands either for

‘9’ is true

or for

That 9 is true.

As he rightly notes, neither of these reconstructions will do; they allow us to conclude, if anything, ‘9’, but not 9, which is what we want. Therefore, Woods concludes, truth as used in

9 is true

is not disquotational. But that makes little sense. After all, if ‘9’ names ‘The cat is on the mat’, then 9 = ‘The cat is on the mat’, in which case neither of Woods’ “oblique readings” of ‘9 is true’ is an accurate reading. We conclude that Woods’ use of ‘disquotational’ is a deviant one, and one that, unfortunately, remains obscure.

It is important to note that Woods never tells us just what, given the stipulation that ‘9’ names ‘The cat is on the mat’, is wrong with

9 is true.

Why isn’t ‘9 is true’ (given the stipulation) simply a claim about a sentence made by using the sentence’s name? He says it cannot but be oblique because “truth is disquotational” (253). In fact, he asserts that

… is true

is not really the form of an assertion of truth. Rather, it is

‘…’ is true.

This is because “Truth is disquotational; it is also quotational” (255; emphasis in original). But what does it mean for truth-assertions to have the latter form? Does it simply mean that ‘is true’ must be preceded by a name? It cannot; ‘9’ is a name, but Woods claims that ‘9 is true’ is illegitimate (255). Does it mean that truth-assertions must literally include quotation marks to be legitimate? It cannot; Woods mentions with approval sentences such as ‘What Charlie said is true’. It seems to mean this: that truth-assertions must literally include quotation marks to be taken disquotationally. Woods claims (257) that, were we to disquote

What Charlie said is true,

we would conclude

What Charlie said.

Note that this is another inference of the form (MT), a form that is not disquotation as usually understood. Woods follows (DT1) and (DT2) whenever a orthographically includes quotation marks; he follows (MT) whenever it does not. This is a significant departure from standard accounts of what it is for truth to be disquotational, and it is entirely unargued for (as far as we can see). A usual disquotational inference involving ‘What Charlie said is true’ would look something like this (where, again, we stipulate that ‘p’ is a sentence):

(a) What Charlie said is true.
(b) What Charlie said = ‘p’.
(c) ‘p’ is true, by substitution in (a).
(d) p, by disquotation on (c).

Woods’ attack on such arguments is merely this: substitution is blocked because such an assertion as (a) is oblique (254). Again, we are given no reason to conclude that (a) is oblique. If, however, we allow standard disquotational inferences like the one above, Woods’ argument crumbles. His attack on the Liar paradox requires

(1) is true

to fail to be a legitimate assertion; however, he gives us no reason to believe this, besides reminders that “truth is disquotational” and an occasional inference of the form (MT), which we have no reason to accept.

That, then, is Woods’ account of the Liar when it refers to itself by name — the derivation fails due to opacity. Unfortunately, Woods’ “opacity”-claims turn on a notion of disquotation that remains unclear, and in that respect his account of the Liar remains unclear. (Note that Brian Skyrms argued in the 70s and 80s that the Liar fails for reasons of opacity, that ‘… is true’ is opaque. But Woods’ position is not Skyrms’ position, as Skyrms’ argument for opacity invokes standard disquotation and turns simply on the premise that substitution of identicals fails in the Liar derivation — it must fail, on pain of inconsistency, according to Skyrms. It would have been useful to see Woods’ discussion of Skyrms’ position, but Woods does not discuss it.)

Recall that the Liar can refer to itself in at least two other ways beyond using a (constant) name: by indexical and by definite description. So even if we accept Woods’ account of the “name Liar,” he still owes us an account of these other sorts. Although he does not provide an account of the “indexical Liar”

This sentence is false

he does provide an account of what he calls the “Following-Preceding Paradox” (264). If we let ‘FS’ abbreviate ‘the following sentence’, and ‘PS’ ‘the preceding sentence’, then the following pair is often taken to be paradoxical:

FS is true.
PS is false.

We rehearse Woods’ argument to contradiction (264-265):

(a) Suppose FS is true.
(b) FS = ‘PS is false’.
(c) So ‘PS is false’ is true, by substitution in (a).
(d) PS is false, by disquotation on (c).
(e) PS = ‘FS is true’.
(f) ‘FS is true’ is false, by substitution in (d).
(g) FS is false, by bivalence.
(h) Suppose FS is false.
(i) ‘PS is false’ is false, by substitution in (g).
(j) PS is true, by bivalence.
(k) ‘FS is true’ is true, by substitution in (j).
(l) FS is true, by disquotation on (k).

Woods advises us to be a bit more careful. ‘FS is true’, he says, can be more perspicaciously rendered as

(4) The sentence immediately following this very sentence is true.

Likewise, ‘PS is false’ is perhaps better put thusly:

(5) The sentence immediately preceding this very sentence is false.

We should wonder, Woods claims, about what ‘this very sentence’ means. It seems that in the first sentence,

(6) This very sentence = ‘The sentence immediately following this very sentence is true.’

and in the second sentence,

(7) This very sentence = ‘The sentence immediately preceding this very sentence is false.’

Thus, by transitivity of identity,

‘The sentence immediately following this very sentence is true’ = ‘The sentence immediately preceding this very sentence is false.’

This is unacceptable; what has gone wrong? Woods claims that (6) and (7) are to blame. He says that in identity assertions like these, “[L]eft ‘This very sentence’ refers to itself if it refers at all. But it is not a sentence, rather an empty singular term. So is [sic] does not refer, and the identity collapses” (266, emphasis in original).

We think that a more natural evaluation of the problem is available. What makes indexicals indexicals is their sensitivity to context. The above argument is insensitive to such sensitivity. On one natural reading of the indexicals above, (6) is true given that its context is (4); (7) is true given that its context is (5). Further, once we become aware of context in this way, the contradiction is indeed derivable. Woods owes us some argument against this sort of account of indexicals, but none is given.

Even if we accept Woods’ arguments regarding Liars that refer to themselves using names and indexicals, there remains a third type of Liar sentence, one that uses definite descriptions:

(8) The last-displayed sentence in the section labeled ‘Woods on the Liar’ in Beall and Ripley’s review of Paradox and Paraconsistency is false.

But no account at all is given of such sentences; they are not so much as mentioned. So it seems that Woods is left with the Liar paradox and its cousins in all three forms.

Closing Remarks

It is important for philosophers to discuss the resolution of logical disagreements. Paradox and Paraconsistency is a good effort in this direction, and Woods’ exposition of stipulationism in the abstract sciences is valuable. While some of Woods’ arguments are unconvincing and his discussion of the semantic paradoxes seems to be based upon a deviant usage of ‘disquotation’ that remains obscure, the book, on the whole, is well worth reading. Conflict resolution in philosophy of logic, of mathematics, and of language, is not only philosophically interesting but also practically important (for purposes of progress). Woods’ discussion serves as a very good point of departure.

We also feel obliged to note that the book has frequent typographical errors throughout, enough to significantly slow the reader.