Paradoxes and Inconsistent Mathematics

Paradoxes And Inconsistent Mathematics

Zach Weber, Paradoxes and Inconsistent Mathematics, Cambridge University Press, 2022, 324pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108834414.

Reviewed by Jc Beall, University of Notre Dame


Zach Weber’s Paradoxes and Inconsistent Mathematics is easily one of the most important books in inconsistent mathematics—and contradiction-involving theories in general—since the pioneering books of Chris Mortensen (1995; 2010), Graham Priest (2006) and Richard Sylvan (formerly Routley) (1980). I am a glut theorist (i.e., the full truth of reality involves some contradictions); however, I strongly disagree with much of Weber’s ‘dialethic’ program (more on terminology below). But not since said pioneering works have I encountered a more important book on would-be true contradictory theories than Weber’s.

A review of Weber’s book could go in two directions: one is to zero in on the new results in inconsistent mathematics (second half of the book) and the extent to which they should be accepted. The other is to focus on the striking, novel big picture of contradiction that Weber paints (first half of the book). I focus on the latter (big picture) direction because it will be of interest to a wider readership (and doesn’t presuppose any technical mathematics). This review is written for general philosophers, not specialists.

In what follows I first set some background (as historically important works deserve historical stage setting); I then situate Weber’s book and his program (the ‘dialethic worldview’) against the canvassed backdrop; and then—because such an important book deserves no less—I close the substance of this review with what strikes me as a conspicuous problem with said program. The final (though not substantive) section of this review simply indicates the contents/roles of the given chapters.

1. Some big-picture background

Many analytic philosophers accept that some sentences are ‘gappy’, that there are ‘truth-value gaps’—meaningful (declarative) sentences that are neither true nor false. The logical dual of a gappy sentence is a ‘truth-value glut’—a meaningful (declarative) sentence that is both true and false.[1] For a long time, the sight of otherwise unavoidable contradiction pushed philosophers to accept the existence of gaps. It took a very long time for the pushing to go the other direction.

Back in the mid-1960s, during a growing surge of work around so-called paraconsistent logic (i.e., consequence relations that do not validate the pattern A ∧ ¬A ∴ B) the mathematician Florencio Asenjo, writing in the Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, advanced the claim that true mathematics involves gluts—true contradictions (i.e., truths of the form A ∧ ¬A) or, as Asenjo called them, antinomies (1960). (Asenjo’s paper was based on his earlier 1950s dissertation work.) Asenjo’s pioneering claim was made with no serious argument (or fanfare) worth the name; however, his implicit argument was clear. In short: that the familiar ‘antinomies’ of mathematics (e.g., sets that are members of themselves iff not, etc.) are not only inevitable when one aims for full mathematical generality; they are important mathematical objects. With Asenjo’s short paper, wanting in argument and wanting in the formal precision demanded of contemporary logicians (Asenjo was a mathematician but not a trained logician), glut-theoretic approaches to familiar paradoxes were born.

The intriguing birth of glut-theoretic accounts of paradox (or, generally, glut-theoretic accounts of any phenomenon) would proceed no further without real argument. Enter the work of Priest (1979, 2006), Routley/Sylvan (1979), and Mortensen (1995). To this day, the most famous argument for gluts is Priest’s argument from ‘semantic closure’,[2] wherein a kicking away of the standard need for ‘metalanguages’ is front and center. The central premise of that argument is that the true and complete (prime) theory of (say) the English language is to be given in a theory whose language is the  natural language itself and not a metalanguage.[3] But, as the ‘limitative’ results of Tarski and, relatedly, Gödel showed, the would-be true and complete (prime) theory of English—if said premise is true—is glutty; it is negation-inconsistent; it is contradictory. The vast majority of researchers reject that the true theory of English is contradictory; instead, they say that the true (prime) theory of English is given in a theory whose language differs from English. Priest (and, relatedly, Sylvan’s) central arguments push against the relevant possibility of a language that can suitably differ from the resources of English (or any natural language). Indeed, even Tarski, from whose work the ongoing argument gets its name (namely, ‘semantic closure’), argued that no language can outstrip the ever-resourceful expressive power of natural languages. As a result, if you think that there is a true theory of English (or some such language) then you’re stuck with gluts. Or so the argument goes. And the now-familiar ‘ism’ associated with the kicking away of metalanguages is reflected in the neologism coined by Priest and Routley—namely, ‘dialethism’ (sometimes ‘dialetheism’).[4]

2. The big question arises

Just how far does the ‘dialethic’ rejection of metalanguages—in effect, the rejection of the necessity of metatheories—go?[5] Is it only with respect to the true theory of natural languages? What of true mathematical theories? And what of the true theory of those true mathematical theories? What of other phenomena (e.g., tractors, salamanders, whathaveyou) and their respective true theories? Does the ‘ism’ against the necessity of metalanguages apply to all true theories?

3. Enter the next stage of evolution: Weber’s book

The most famous argument for gluts, as above, is one whereby the necessity of metalanguages (and metatheories equipped with such languages) is rejected: the truth, at least of natural languages, is expressed in a theory whose language is said target natural language. And this is a pillar in the particular glut-theoretic account of language called ‘dialethism’, as Weber (96) affirms quoting Priest:

the whole point of the dialetheic solution to the semantic paradoxes is to get rid of the distinction between object language and meta-language. (1990, 208, emphasis original)

Weber pushes ‘the whole point of the dialethic solution’ to all true theories—and, hence, all true theories of any true theory, and so on. In particular, the true (meta-) theory of the true theory of logical consequence need not differ with respect to either language or its consequence (entailment, validity) relation. In short—and an extraordinary theme of Weber’s book—every true theory is governed by a ‘logic’ (i.e., consequence or validity relation) that is paraconsistent (invalidates A ∧ ¬A ∴ B)! This, in the end, is what, as Weber’s work reflects, the ‘thoroughgoing dialethic account’ and/or ‘any “final” dialethic worldview’ demands (see p. 82ff.).

For the first time since the term was made up, Weber’s book (perhaps unintentionally) puts the ism of ‘dialethism’ prominently on the table: a rejection of the necessity of metalanguages and/or metatheories that differ from their respective object theories in either the language or the theory’s consequence relation. This might (probably does) appear to be ho-hum to the non-specialist. The shattering implications of ‘the dialethic worldview’ are anything but ho-hum.

4. Two avenues of glut theory

Appreciating the boldness and importance of ‘the dialetheic worldview’—in contrast to non-dialethic glutty ‘worldviews’—is helped by noting two salient paths for glut-theoretic accounts of a phenomenon. All glut theorists agree (by definition) that some true theories are negation-inconsistent; the theories are glutty. Most (perhaps even all extant) glut theorists also agree (not by definition) that logical consequence does not validate the pattern

A, ¬A B

where ¬ is logical negation.[6] For present purposes, let’s assume that all glut theorists accept the two given points.

What follows about the necessity of metatheories or metalanguages? More to a theme of Weber’s book: what follows about having true and classical-logic-closed theories of a phenomenon? (Reminder: talk of theories in this context involves prime theories.) The big ‘ism’ in ‘dialethism’, as Weber’s work reflects, is striking: there are no true classically closed theories! In short, every true and complete (in the sense of ‘full’ or ‘exhaustive’) theory is negation-inconsistent—glutty, contradictory! This is as astonishing as it is fascinating, even for non-dialethic glut theorists (such as myself).

There are two common avenues for ‘worldviews’ about gluts: one is to see them as peculiar and limited (e.g., maybe ‘spandrels’ of other things); another is altogether  novel and owes entirely  to Weber—namely, they’re ubiquitous and thereby very common and in each and every domain of phenomena. The former avenue towards glut theory is the common one, advanced in various degrees by some glut theorists (e.g., myself, Asenjo, perhaps Mortensen) and some less-than-full-blooded dialetheists such as Priest—at least measuring full-blooded-ness by Weber’s clarification of the dialethic program.

4.1. The common glut-theoretic ‘worldview’

On the gluts-as-peculiar ‘worldview’ there are three common methodological rules of thumb in the search for true theories.

  • Completeness: seek complete theories! In other words, for any A in the language of the theory, seek to put either A or its logical negation ¬A in the theory. (This rule of thumb reflects the pursuit of gap-free theories.)
  • Consistency: seek consistent theories! In other words, for any A in the language of the theory, seek to put exactly A or its logical negation ¬A in the theory. (This rule of thumb reflects the pursuit of glut-free theories.)
  • Naturalness/Simplicity: seek the most natural, simplest description of the target phenomenon! (There’s no precise version of this methodological rule of thumb.)

Reality, of course, can be recalcitrant (to invoke Quine’s old phrase): some phenomena buck the satisfaction of all three methodological rules. What to do? Answer: just do the best one can! (If there were a simple and precise rule that told us when to buck that rule over this rule, the pursuit of truth would’ve successfully ended long ago.) On the common glut-theoretic ‘worldview’, the true theories of most phenomena satisfy the consistency rule. Indeed, on the common glut-theoretic ‘worldview’, phenomena that demand a bucking of the consistency rule are few and far between. Glut theorists sharing this ‘worldview’ differ mostly on just how few the few exceptions to consistent (true) theories actually are; they don’t differ on there being a true-blue few.

Note that on the common glut-theoretic view, patterns such as

¬A, A B B

are logically invalid—that is, not sanctioned or guaranteed by the lights of logical consequence (where, even on Weber’s view, logical consequence is the consequence relation governing universal, topic-neutral vocabulary, the vocabulary involved in all true theories). But the logical in-validity of said pattern doesn’t in any fashion imply that the language of every true theory has instances of the pattern that refute its validity! (Think in terms of a space of possibilities. Logical possibilities are the widest and easiest. There are, arguably, gappy ones and glutty ones and the familiar classical-logic-recognized ones. The glutty ones are enough to refute the logical validity of the given pattern; however, many true theories rule out the glutty possibilities as theoretical im-possibilities—as irrelevant possibilities in the way that true physics rules out irrelevant logical possibilities that would otherwise refute physical laws.)

The critical point: on the common glut-theoretic view, patterns such as above (e.g., ¬A, A B B) may be T-valid for some true theories T, even though, obviously, they’re logically in-valid. Knowing which theories truly rule out which regions of logical possibilities goes back to methodological rules of thumb: doing the best one can.

So goes the usual glut-theoretic worldview (even if its details aren’t exactly shared by all common glut theorists).

4.2. The dialethic worldview

Weber’s novel (evolution of) ‘the dialethic worldview’ (the ultimate ‘ism’ in ‘dialethism’) flips the common glut-theoretic view on its head. Per Weber:

[gluts emerge] when you meet your friend at “noonish,” when you buy something that is just a little too expensive, when you remark that nothing your uncle says is true. . . . [The domain of inconsistent phenomena] is everywhere. (96)

A principal argument for such ubiquity comes from sorites arguments. One such argument:

take almost any object; it is a borderline case of some vague predicate. Any red thing is a borderline case of some subcollection within the red things—e.g., the set of “red but also a bit yellowish orange” things. So the collection of objects that are φ and not φ for some closely related predicate is the entire total. (95)

One might wonder whether (and if so, why) such a critical argument rides the back of excluded middle, but set this aside. (I return to excluded middle below.) One can see that if Weber’s argument is sound (or even provides good reason for its conclusion), the ubiquity of gluts thereby sits on a strong foundation. And with the ubiquity of gluts comes the distinguishing feature of a ‘dialethic worldview’, namely, that no true theory can be classically closed, since every true theory—regardless of phenomena in question—‘enjoys’ some dose of contradiction. (One might think that mathematics itself is the clean exception. But, of course, a huge part of the technical work in Weber’s book is intended to illustrate that mathematical phenomena are no exception to the ubiquity of gluts.)

Weber also gives another argument based on the Routley set—a prominent player in Weber’s overall program.[7] The existence of the Routley set is supposed to yield the crucial ubiquity of gluts ‘in one fell swoop’ (95), as it’s supposed to yield the following implications. Per Weber:

  • You are a member of [the Routley set], because you are self-identical, and r r.
  • You are not a member of this set, because ¬(r r), so the conjunction of r r with anything is false. [Reviewer comment for the reader: this assumes excluded middle to avoid gaps.]
  • Therefore, everything has at least one inconsistent property already [viz., being a member of the Routley set and not]. (95)

One might wonder not only about excluded middle but also why contraposition is validated by the would-be true theory of said Routley set. When gluts are around, contraposition is prima facie unnatural. (One might also wonder just what it takes to be a property here.) But, setting these questions aside, it’s clear that if the Routley set is ‘everywhere and nowhere’, as Weber provocatively puts it, the dialethic worldview, unlike the common glut-theoretic ‘worldview’, is once again one according to which there are no true classical-logic-closed theories—because every true theory has in its domain the Routley set (or so goes the idea)!

5. A final salute to an important and refreshingly novel work

I have hinted at some of the we-should-pause points in Weber’s clarification of ‘the dialethic worldview’ (and the ubiquity-of-gluts arguments on which it rests); however, before flagging what strikes at least me as a simple but very glaring problem in the dialethic worldview (versus other glut-theoretic ‘worldviews’), I must re-emphasize the novelty and importance of Weber’s book. No glut theorist before Weber has advanced such a fascinating and, at least to my gob, gobsmacking glut theory—putting a boldface ‘ism’ in ‘dialethism’, setting it firmly apart as a specific and fascinating glut theory. Weber’s book purports to put gluts not on the usual shelves of rare curiosities but rather at your doorstep—utterly common and ubiquitous features of each phenomenon in reality! Gluts are not only those very familiar items from work on paradoxes; they are in the very warp and woof of ordinary life—every level of ordinary and, indeed, extraordinary life. This picture—the ‘dialethic worldview’ (which clearly warrants an ‘ism’!)—truly is novel and opens up a great many issues not only in Weber’s technical work in mathematics (which, as throughout, I pass over here so as to indicate the wide-ranging reach of Weber’s work beyond mathematics); the advanced worldview opens up a great many issues in all areas of philosophy and science. To repeat: I consider the book to be easily one of the most important works in glut theory since the pioneers mentioned above.

But importance, fascination, and intrigue are not features that preclude problems. By my lights, there are a number of problems confronting the dialethic version of glut theory, at least as clarified in Weber’s book. I briefly close with just one, leaving debate to weigh the apparent problem.

6. A hole in the dialethic worldview

The most glaring flag— the only one I explicitly mention—concerns excluded middle. Why does the dialethic worldview acknowledge, on one hand, the logical possibility of gluts while, on the other, blocking out the logical possibility of gaps? After all, gaps are just gluts upside down, so to speak—or in the mirror. A gappy possibility is one in which some sentence A is neither true nor false (i.e., neither A nor its logical negation is true at the possibility); a glutty possibility is one in which some sentence A is both true and false (i.e., both A and its logical negation are true at the possibility). Here, a logical possibility is one within the reach of logical consequence; they are the possibilities that serve as would-be counterexamples to logical validity. The dialethic glut theorist, like most (and perhaps all extant) glut theorists, recognizes the logical possibility of gluts that serves to counterexample the logical validity of the pattern

A ¬A B

But there’s then something imbalanced, unnatural, asymmetric and, prima facie, ad hoc to preclude the dual (gappy) possibilities that otherwise counterexample the logical validity of the (dual) pattern

B A ¬A.

The ‘dialethic worldview’ is one in which, if properly filled out (which is the job of Weber’s novel work), essentially involves the ubiquity of gluts. For all that Weber has argued, said ubiquity of gluts rests on the logical validity of excluded middle (in effect, the logical validity of B A ¬A). But the logical validity of excluded middle rests on the absence of gappy possibilities. That’s not just a clear absence; it’s an apparent hole in the dialethic worldview.[8]

The dialethic worldview, otherwise marvelously painted (and certainly clarified) in Weber’s book, is a worldview that ultimately rests on the unexplained absence of gappy (logical) possibilities. The problem is that when the logical possibility of gaps is brought into (the world-) view, the ubiquity of gluts—and with it, the absence of classical-logic-closed true theories—collapses, at least with respect to deductive support (which Weber demands, per p. 94f). In the end, the supposed absence of gappy possibilities is itself a conspicuous explanatory gap in Weber’s principal explanation concerning gluts.

The common glut-theoretic ‘worldview’—unlike the dialethic worldview (as clarified by Weber’s work)—can easily allow both gappy possibilities and glutty possibilities. Some glut theorists do just that. But the distinctively dialethic worldview, to keep its distinctive constraints (e.g., as above, no necessary metalanguages, and, per Weber’s development, no classical-logic-closed true theories), must reject the logical possibility of gaps or either lose the ubiquity of gluts that Weber’s book emphasizes or give phenomenon-specific arguments for excluding gaps in all true theories (something Weber explicitly eschews).

Weber has helpfully clarified ‘dialethism’ from other glut-theoretic accounts. Said hole in the story is an area for future work. I, for one, look forward to the future development.

7. Final book-keeping: the chapter breakdown

I’ve painted only the big picture, and flagged at least one issue for future debate. The role of this final section of the review is merely to indicate the chapter contents.

The first four chapters, which make up Parts I and II, will be (or should be) of interest to all philosophers. It’s a mesmerizing picture, full of interesting arguments. The remaining chapters are solidly in inconsistent maths—mathematics in which there are some mathematical gluts (i.e., contradictory objects), much as Asenjo originally thought in nascent ways. The development of such inconsistent maths from the pioneering ideas and perspective of Asenjo to Weber’s latest work is as significant as the development from chiseling stone tablets to recent smart phones. (Whether the development is good for humanity at large is an open question, perhaps in both cases.) The final six chapters are important (technical) developments in inconsistent or glut-theoretic mathematics—mathematics that involve at least some gluts. (And because this is ‘the dialethic worldview’, as evolved and clarified by Weber, constraints on the particular results in glut-theoretic mathematics essentially involve excluded middle and a host of glutty objects—for example, Russell/Cantor sets—that other glut-theoretic mathematics might not involve. What is highly significant within the specialized project of inconsistent mathematics from the specifically dialethic perspective is Weber’s illustration of how to ‘prove’ the existence of gluts using only the resources of a gap-free logic weaker than classical.) Weber’s work in these chapters is interesting and important, but they demand background that I am not assuming in this review for non-specialists.

The chapters run as follows:

  1. Paradoxes; or, “Here in the Presence of an Absurdity” is a parade of paradoxes involving sets, vagueness and spatial boundaries.
  2. In Search of a Uniform Solution critically examines extant attempts at explaining the existence of paradoxes (qua gluts on the worldview laid out).
  3. Metatheory and Naive Theory is in many ways the critical chapter for the book’s big picture (and, in many ways, the motivation behind the technical second-half chapters in glut-theoretic mathematics tied to the specifically ‘dialethic worldview’).
  4. Prolegomena to Any Future Inconsistent Mathematics rehearses and responds to the challenges posed by so-called Curry paradox(-es).
  5. Set Theory sets out the ‘places’ of glutty sets on the specifically dialethic worldview.
  6. Arithmetic sets out the ‘places’ of glutty numbers on the specifically dialethic worldview.
  7. Algebra sets out the ‘places’ of glutty algebraic objects on the specifically dialethic worldview.
  8. Real Analysis sets out the ‘places’ of glutty items in the continuum on the specifically dialethic worldview.
  9. Topology sets out the ‘places’ of topological items (think ‘blends’ of continuum and sets) on the specifically dialethic worldview.
  10. Ordinary Paradox is a retrospective summary of the ubiquity of gluts, not only in everyday life but in mathematics.


Asenjo, F. G. (1966) A calculus of antinomies. Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 7(1):103–105.

Fine, K. (1975) Vagueness, truth and logic. Synthese, 30:265–300.

Mortensen, C. (1995) Inconsistent Mathematics. Kluwer Academic Publishers.

Mortensen, C. (2010) Inconsistent Geometry, volume 27 of Studies in Logic. College Publications.

Priest, G. (1979) The logic of paradox. Journal of Philosophical Logic, 8:219–241.

Priest, G. (1990) Boolean negation and all that. Journal of Philosophical Logic, 19(2):201–215.

Priest, G. (2006) In Contradiction. Oxford University Press, Oxford, second edition. First printed by Martinus Nijhoff in 1987.

Routley, R. (1979) Dialectical logic, semantics and metamathematics. Erkenntnis, 14:301–331.

Routley, R. (1980) Exploring Meinong’s Jungle and Beyond: An Investigation of Noneism and the Theory of Items. Research School of Social Sciences, Australian National University.

Routley, R., Meyer, R. K. (1976) Dialectical logic, classical logic, and the consistency of the world. Studies in East European Thought, 16(1- 2):1–25.

[1] To my knowledge, the term ‘glut’, so understood, was first used in print by Kit Fine (1975).

[2] Note that the work of Routley and Meyer (1976) around the same time explores the same basic argument from a broader perspective.

[3] A theory is prime iff arbitrary disjunction A∨ B, in the language of the theory, is in the theory iff one of the disjuncts is in the theory.

[4] This was a term whose motivation has been tied to various things, from being a better term than Hegel’s term ‘dialectic’ to the idea of ‘two-way truth’ (which makes sense for liar-ish sentences but not so much for other potential gluts), to supposedly carrying better connotations than ‘(truth-value) gluts’. Sometimes, the term is said to be nothing but a synonym for ‘glut’ or ‘true contradiction’, where a contradiction is any sentence (proposition, whatever) that entails a sentence (proposition, whatever) of the form it is true that. . . and it is false that. . . . But, of course, there need be no ‘ism’ in accepting that there are gluts (true contradictions) any more than there’s an ‘ism’ in accepting that there are true conjunctions. (For that matter, there needn’t be some special ‘ism’ in accepting that there are gaps (untrue contradictions).) A (perhaps unintended) virtue of Weber’s book is that it finally puts the ‘ism’ in ‘dialethism’ squarely on the table—a point clarified below.

[5] For readers unfamiliar with the distinction, the object theory (ditto language) is the one we’re theorizing (ditto talking) about; the metatheory (ditto language) is the theory of said object theory.

[6] I say ‘most’ because a glut theorist might reject that all true and complete theories are closed under logical consequence. Without the given closure constraint, a glut theorist might accept not only that the true (but not logically closed) theory of X is glutty in that, for some sentence A in the language of the theory, both A and ¬A are in the theory (i.e., true according to the theory); she might also accept that the pattern


A, ¬A B


is logically valid; however, she avoids the absurdity of the trivial theory (viz., the theory containing all sentences in the language of the given theory) by rejecting that true and complete theories are logically closed—i.e., closed under logical consequence/validity. (I ignore this sort of option in what follows, as does Weber throughout.)

[7] I skip details of the set. See p. 95 and p. 167ff. But in short, where r is the familiar Russell/Cantor set (viz., a member of itself and not, at least given excluded middle) and X any set,


Xr = {x : x X and r r}

is the ‘Russellization of X’, and given unrestricted comprehension (which is also ‘the point’ of the dialethic worldview, it appears) the Routley set is

Vr ={x : x = x and r r}


which is the universe of sets ‘to the degree that the Russell [/Cantor] set is a member of itself’ (95).

[8] One might argue that so-called intuitionists and/or constructivists in the philosophy of mathematics don’t seem prone to the same alleged hole; they reject the validity of excluded middle (at least in mathematical theories) while accepting the dual ‘exclusion’ (viz., A ¬A B). But this case is different, since, unlike Weber’s account, the truth and falsity conditions for logical negation are nonstandard (and highly intensional). Weber’s account of logical negation (and here we agree) is exactly the standard one, whereby a negation is true (false) at a possibility iff the negatum is false (true) at the possibility. (Weber then precludes gappy possibilities from the space of logical possibilities.) Thanks to Greg Restall for discussion.