Paradoxes of Religious Toleration in Early Modern Political Thought,

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John Christian Laursen and María José Villaverde (eds.), Paradoxes of Religious Toleration in Early Modern Political Thought, Lexington Books, 2012, 224pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780739172179.

Reviewed by Michael W. Hickson, Santa Clara University


Explaining how to appear tolerant is not very difficult. The outward expression of toleration involves very little positive action -- it is about leaving alone those with whom we disagree about religious, political, or moral issues to believe, act and live how they want. On the other hand, explaining how to be tolerant beyond appearances, and explaining why anyone should be tolerant are more difficult tasks. On the psychological level, but especially on the levels of moral and political justification, toleration can be perplexing. In fact, since at least the publication of the collection of essays, Toleration: An Elusive Virtue, edited by David Heyd, many have suggested that explaining and justifying toleration are so problematic that the very concept of toleration should be considered a paradox: that the defense of toleration, whether considered as a personal virtue (henceforth, 'tolerance') or as a political ideal (henceforth, 'toleration'), leads us ineluctably into contradictions, impossibilities, and absurdities.

In Heyd's collection, Bernard Williams captures the alleged paradox of tolerance best in "Toleration: An Impossible Virtue": "[tolerance] appear[s] impossible because it seemingly require[s] someone to think that a certain belief or practice [is] thoroughly wrong or bad, and at the same time that there [is] some intrinsic good to be found in its being allowed to flourish" (Heyd, p. 25). There are numerous puzzling questions about toleration that other authors have used to motivate the idea of a paradox of toleration. Must we tolerate the intolerant? Is it possible to practice the supposed virtue of tolerance without expressing the vices of condescension or arrogance? When the toleration in question is religious, the puzzles are even more intractable (for religious believers, in any case): why should we tolerate beliefs or practices that offend God and may invite his wrath? do we not harm those whom we tolerate by permitting them to do what may lead them to suffer eternally in hell?

Others have argued, however, that there are no paradoxes of toleration; there are merely difficulties involved in defending toleration, just as there are difficulties involved in defending any moral or political ideal (see for example, Jeremy J. Waldron, "Toleration: Is There a Paradox?"). These authors believe that to call toleration a 'paradox' is either loose or overly pessimistic. They argue that "one can set up an appearance of paradox," but that "the appearance of paradox is very easy to dispel" (Waldron, p. 2). All that is needed is careful thinking about the psychological, normative, and political issues involved.

Those interested in these issues will welcome John Christian Laursen and María José Villaverde's collection. Perhaps toleration really is a paradoxical concept. Or maybe contemporary authors find toleration paradoxical because they are thinking about it the wrong way. One approach to this debate is to study the history of philosophical reflection on the subject. Has the defense of toleration always been fraught with paradox? Have the paradoxes always been the same ones? Have any alleged paradoxes ever been confronted and resolved? The essays in this volume are intended to answer these sorts of questions and in so doing to offer a unique perspective on the history of toleration in the early modern period. That perspective is to focus not only on the most important successes of toleration theorists, but also, and even predominately, on the "complexities, the complications, the surprises, and the inconsistencies that came up in the seventeenth and eighteenth centuries as people grappled with the idea of toleration" (1).

This is a solid scholarly collection on a wide variety of authors, sects, groups, states, and regions associated with toleration in the early modern period. The titular subjects are Spinoza, Jansenism, Arnauld, Jurieu, Bayle, the Dutch Republic, Leibniz, China and Siam, Denis Veiras, Hume, Rousseau, Kant, and the "French antiphilosophes". Those interested in one or more of these should own this book.

The editors did not intend to assemble a collection that would be "merely" historical, however. They aimed to produce a volume relevant to contemporary political theorists worried about the paradoxical nature of toleration. The book as a whole is supposed to tell us something about why toleration is, or is not, a paradox. In the introduction, after citing a few of the classic alleged paradoxes of toleration, the editors promise that all the essays' authors will "uncover more subtle, more surprising paradoxes" (2). They note that while the essays are historical, they also have contemporary relevance: by uncovering the "blind spots" of past toleration theorists, we can come to recognize our own blind spots, and even discover how to overcome them (2).

I am convinced that this volume makes a considerable contribution to the literatures on the history of toleration and on early modern political thought more generally. But it is less clear to me whether it does much to clarify why toleration appears to be a paradoxical concept today. Few of the essays uncover paradoxes as strong as the sort Williams writes about in his essay. By a 'strong paradox' I mean a series of considerations that leads the reader to feel that he must contradict himself at some point. The majority of these essays focus at best on what Waldron has called "appearances of paradoxes" (again, see the citation above). And in several of the essays I could not find anything that philosophers would count as a paradox at all, strong or apparent.

For example, in "Spinoza's Paradoxes," María José Villaverde argues that Spinoza's toleration extended to people of any "beliefs no matter what faith or ideas they professed" (31). Villaverde also argues that Spinoza was a pantheist who was interested in alchemy. This essay will therefore interest expert historians in the thick of debates about Spinoza's attitude toward organized religion, his possible atheism, his relation to the scientific community, and the reception of his numerous controversial works. But the "Paradoxes" of the title bear little resemblance to the sort of thing with which I began this review or with which the editors begin their introduction. The paradoxes are instead the usual interpretive difficulties encountered by historians while reading Spinoza on a variety of subjects, including freedom of thought and expression.

There are several other papers that are excellent, perhaps even among the best in the collection from the point of view of rigor and originality, but that have very little to say about paradoxes of toleration. In "A Leibnizian Way to Tolerance," Concha Roldán demonstrates that Leibniz's approach to toleration differs from the approaches of Bayle and Locke. This is because it moves beyond the negative conception of toleration as "putting up with" to a more positive view of toleration as a necessary condition for eventual conciliation between the disputing parties. It is less a political principle than it is a principle of rational dialectic (96). Joaquín Abellán makes a similar point about moving beyond the concept of tolerance as "putting up with" in "Immanuel Kant: Tolerance seen as Respect." In "Toleration in Denis Veiras's Theocracy," Cyrus Masroori gives an account of Veiras's utopian vision in the History of the Sevarambians, focusing on the role that toleration plays in Sevarambia. The paradox -- or rather, surprise -- which Masroori outlines is that despite the historical tendency of absolutist and theocratic regimes toward intolerance, Veiras chose a theocracy for Sevarambia and made toleration one of its crucial policies.

Other papers in the volume deal with paradoxical authors, more than with paradoxes of toleration. We have seen an example in the case of Villaverde's essay on Spinoza. Further examples are the essays on Hume and Rousseau. In "David Hume on Religious Tolerance," Gerardo López Sastre does the difficult work of systematizing Hume's various scattered remarks on tolerance, and concludes that "what Hume proposes is, on the one side, a policy of tolerance, as we know by now that for him tolerance is a matter of principle, and at the same time a skillful expedient to allay religious fervor. The second proposal is, on the other side, an established church with priests bribed to be indolent" (152). Hume's dual proposal of tolerance and an established church might have seemed paradoxical, but López Sastre's presentation is so clear that it seems by the end of the article to have been a natural pairing for Hume. (According to Henri Krop, "The General Freedom which All Men Enjoy," this dual proposal was also apparently favored throughout much of the Dutch Republic at the time (87).)

In "Rousseau, A False Apostle of Tolerance," Villaverde again shows adeptness in wrestling with enigmatic thinkers. Villaverde's conclusion is that

Rousseau is, in effect, split between the tolerance of the Enlightenment, which he sincerely believes he shares, and the intolerance of Catholics, which he detests but relates to because he cannot accept universal tolerance. Furthermore, to guarantee his ideal society, he resorts to an absolutist democracy that imposes the general will and does not respect individual rights, and a civic and patriotic religion that exploits intolerance against those who do not share his views (172).

Compared to these essays, there is a greater appearance of a paradox of toleration in John Christian Laursen's "Spinoza on Lying for Toleration and His Intolerance of Atheists." He offers "an exploration of the relevance for the theory of toleration of strategies for obtaining toleration by lying" (39). Laursen reflects on the possible merits and pitfalls of obtaining toleration by dishonest means by focusing on Spinoza's seven dogmas in chapter 14 of the Tractatus Theologico-Politicus, possibly intended by Spinoza as the necessary conditions for any sect's deserving religious toleration. He considers whether Spinoza himself may have been lying in offering this creed as a statement of his own beliefs, and whether he was urging atheists to lie about believing this minimal religious creed when he left wide open the possible interpretations one could give of the seven dogmas. Laursen's essay is full of puzzles: is it wrong to achieve toleration through dishonesty? more generally, when is dishonesty a good political strategy? The chapter ends with a section comparing Spinoza to contemporary authors who have reflected on the value of public lying.

Luisa Simonutti ("Jansenist Fears and Huguenot Polemics") explores further paradoxical tensions that exist when trying to balance, on the one hand, obedience to a king, and on the other hand, obedience to individual conscience. Simonutti shows how Arnauld, Jurieu, and Bayle each struck a balance between the two with their respective accounts of the rights of kings and the rights of conscience, and concludes that "every side in these debates claimed to be tolerant, and that the other sides were intolerant. That is probably one of the most common paradoxes of the early debates over toleration" (65). Simonutti hits on a deep paradox that exists within conscience-based arguments for toleration: these arguments rarely intend to be subversive of political authority, but to the extent that they offer conscience as the supreme authority over the individual, they risk such subversion nonetheless.

In "Intolerance of Fanatics in Bayle, Hume, and Kant," Laursen brings to light a novel Baylian, and also Kantian, paradox of toleration. He argues that Bayle and Kant demonstrated paradoxical opposition to fanaticism, extremism, and enthusiasm of many varieties: paradoxical, because their opposition was itself fanatical, extreme, and enthusiastic. Adding another layer of puzzlement, Laursen argues that the reason for their anti-fanaticism was the fact that both Bayle and Kant sympathized with the motives of the fanaticism they opposed, and even shared those motives to some extent. (Laursen argues that Hume, by contrast, was less extreme in his critique of fanaticism, but was ultimately more intolerant than Bayle or Kant of views different from his own.) Laursen uncovers strong paradoxes of toleration. His essay is also of value today for anyone thinking about how best to oppose religious extremism without falling into an equally intolerant extremism.

In "Toleration in China and Siam in Late Seventeenth-Century European Travel Literature," Rolando Minuti details the perspectives of early modern European explorers on the toleration policies of the Chinese and Siamese rulers. The apparent paradox that Minuti uncovers is that toleration is necessary in order to permit the truth to arise and flourish among a people, but once that truth has been discovered, toleration is no longer laudable. Toleration is both good and bad, depending on context and perspective. The European travelers treated by Minuti desired their Asian hosts to practice toleration, particularly toward Christian missionaries, but only until the emperor had been converted to Christianity, at which point the desired policy would be one of "virtuous intolerance" toward all other false religions (113).

Jonathan Israel ("Tolerance and Intolerance in the Writings of the French Antiphilosophes") presents a conflict between what he calls the philosophes and antiphilosophes of the Enlightenment, and in so doing uncovers a classic paradox of toleration. The antiphilosophes, such as the Jesuit Nonnotte who was a bitter enemy of Voltaire, argued that the universal toleration proposed by the new philosophers was not sincere, but masked an underlying intent to destroy religion. The paradox here is that while universal toleration would seem to protect religions and support diversity, it in fact destroys all religion: "What the philosophes call 'la tolérance universelle' is thus based on an entirely bogus moderation behind which lurks the uncompromising reality that reason is the only tribunal they respect" (203).

The level of historical rigor and scholarly erudition displayed by the authors was consistently very high. The collection will be cited often by those working in the history of early modern political thought. However, the level of engagement with things that philosophers would consider paradoxes was by comparison inconsistent. Having worked on a strong early modern paradox of toleration, Bayle's so-called "Persecutor Paradox" (which was not treated in this volume, even though Bayle was repeatedly discussed) I was eager to see what other strong paradoxes of toleration existed in the period. Was it the fact that Bayle grounded his theory of toleration on conscience -- also a paradoxical concept -- that led him into contradictions? Or were other early modern theories of toleration that were not based in conscience just as prone to paradoxical conclusions? I expected to find more explicit answers to these questions in this volume.

Nevertheless, the collection has put me, and will put many others, in a better position to explore these issues. Few of the most well-known early modern philosophers wrote entire treatises on toleration, so it is difficult to assess their views on the subject. Several of the volume's authors did the difficult work of synthesizing various philosophers' views on toleration -- Rousseau's, Hume's, and Kant's, for example. This is an invaluable service to others working in the field. Other authors, even if they did not engage strong paradoxes of toleration, nevertheless explored what may be the signs of underlying paradoxes, and have therefore pointed researchers in the right direction. In this respect the essays are full of what the editors promised -- "complexities, complications, surprises" (2). A final virtue of this collection is that it has suggested and often exemplified a promising approach to the question of whether or why toleration is paradoxical: a historical approach that seeks to trace contemporary philosophical problems back to their origins in centuries-old assumptions, prejudices, or other hereditary "blind spots". We need more collections that attempt, as this one does, to bring historians and researchers working on contemporary issues into dialogue.


David Heyd (ed.), Toleration: An Elusive Virtue (Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1996).

Jeremy J. Waldron, "Toleration: Is There a Paradox?" New York University Public Law and Legal Theory Working Papers (2013). Paper 376. Website consulted 5/20//2013.