Paradoxes of Time Travel

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Ryan Wasserman, Paradoxes of Time Travel, Oxford University Press, 2018, 240pp., $60.00, ISBN 9780198793335.

Reviewed by John W. Carroll, North Carolina State


Wasserman's book fills a gap in the academic literature on time travel. The gap was hidden among the journal articles on time travel written by physicists for physicists, the popular books on time travel by physicists for the curious folk, the books on the history of time travel in science fiction intended for a range of scholarly audiences, and the journal articles on time travel written for and by metaphysicians and philosophers of science. There are metaphysics books on time that give some attention to time travel, but, as far as I know, this is the first book length work devoted to the topic of time travel by a metaphysician homed in on the most important metaphysical issues. Wasserman addresses these issues while still managing to include pertinent scientific discussion and enjoyable time-travel snippets from science fiction. The book is well organized and is suitable for good undergraduate metaphysics students, for philosophy graduate students, and for professional philosophers. It reads like a sophisticated and excellent textbook even though it includes many novel ideas.

The research Wasserman has done is impressive. It reminds the reader that time travel as a topic of metaphysics did not start with David Lewis (1976). Wasserman (p. 2 n 4) identifies Walter B. Pitkin's 1914 journal article as (probably) the first academic discussion of time travel. The article includes a description of what has come to be called the double-occupancy problem, a puzzle about spatial location and time machines that trace a continuous path through space. The same note also includes a lovely passage, which anticipates paradoxes about changing the past, from Enrique Gaspar's 1887 book:

We may unwrap time but we don't know how to nullify it. If today is a consequence of yesterday and we are living examples of the present, we cannot unless we destroy ourselves, wipe out a cause of which we are the actual effects.

These are just two of the many useful bits of Wasserman's research.

Chapter 1 usefully introduces examples of time travel and some examples one might think would involve time travel, but do not (e.g., changing time zones). There is good discussion of Lewis's definition of time travel as a discrepancy between personal and external time, including a brief passage (p. 13) from a previously unpublished letter from Lewis to Jonathan Bennett on whether freezing and thawing is time travel. I had often wonder what Lewis would have said; now I know what he did say!

Chapter 2 dives into temporal paradoxes deriving from discussions of the status of tense and the ontology of time (presentism vs. eternalism vs. growing block vs. . . . ). Here, Wasserman also includes the double-occupancy problem as a problem for eternalism -- though it is not clear that it is only a problem for eternalism. Then he turns to the question of the compatibility of presentism and time travel, the compatibility of time travel and a version of growing block that accepts that there are no future-tensed truths, and finally to a section on relativity and time travel. The section on relativity is solid and seems to me to pull the rug out from under some earlier discussions. For example, Lewis's definition of time travel is shown not to work. It also becomes clear that presentism and the growing block are consistent with both time-dilation-style forward time travel and traveling-in-a-curved-spacetime "backwards" time travel.

Chapters 3 and 4 cover the granddaddies of all the time-travel paradoxes: the freedom paradoxes that include the grandfather paradox, the possibility of changing the past, and the prospects of such changes given models of branching time, models that invoke parallel worlds, and hyper time models. Chapter 4 gets serious about Lewis's treatment of the grandfather paradox and Kadri Vihvelin's treatment of the autoinfanticide paradox (about which I will have more to say).

Chapter 4 also includes discussion of "mechanical" paradoxes that, as stated, do not require modal premises about what something can and cannot do, and no notion of freedom or free will. (See Earman's bilking argument on p. 139 and the Polchinski paradox on p. 141.) Wasserman introduces modality to these paradoxes, but I would have liked them to be addressed on their own terms. As I see it, these paradoxes are introduced to show that backwards time travel or backwards causation in a certain situation validly lead to a contradiction. On their own terms, for these arguments to be valid, the premises of the arguments themselves must be inconsistent. How can one make trouble for backwards time travel if the argument is thus bound to be unsound?

Chapter 5 takes on the paradoxes generated by causal loops or more generally backwards causation including bilking arguments, the boot-strapping paradox (based on a presumption that self-causation is impossible), and the ex nihilo paradox with causal loops and object loops (i.e., jinn) that seem to have no cause or explanation.

Chapter 6 deals with paradoxes that arise from considerations regarding identity, with a focus on the self-visitation paradox from both perdurantist and endurantist perspectives. I was surprised to learn that Wasserman had defended an endurantist-friendly property compatibilism -- similar to my own -- to resolve the self-visitation paradox. I was then delighted to find out that he cleverly extends this sort of compatibilism to the time-travel-free problem of change (i.e., the so-called, temporary-intrinsics argument).

The outstanding scientific issue regarding backwards time travel is whether it is physically possible. There is no question that forwards time travel is actual, or even whether it is ubiquitous. There is also not much question that backwards time travel is consistent with general relativity. Still, we await more scientific progress before we will know whether backwards time travel really is consistent with the actual laws of nature. In the meantime, there is still much to be said about Lewis's treatment of the grandfather paradox and Vihvelin's stated challenge to that treatment in terms of the autoinfanticide paradox.

I will start by being somewhat critical of Lewis's approach. For his part (pp. 108-114), Wasserman does a terrific job of laying out Lewis's position as a metatheoretic discussion of the context sensitivity of 'can' and 'can't'. My concern is that not enough attention is given to the 'can' and 'can't' sentences that turn out true on the semantics. The semantics works only by a contextual restriction of possible worlds based on relevant facts -- the modal base -- associated with a conversational context. In meager contexts, false 'can' sentences will turn out true too easily. For example, suppose two people are having a conversation about Roger. Maybe all the two know about Roger is his name and that he is moving into the neighborhood. So, the proposition that Roger doesn't play the piano is not in the modal base. So, according to Lewis's semantics applied to 'can', 'Roger can play the piano' is true in this context. That seems wrong. This would be an unwarranted assertion for either of the participants in the conversation to make. Notice it is also true relative to the same meager context that Roger can play the harpsichord, the sousaphone, and the nyatiti. Quite a musician that Roger![1]

Interestingly, though this problem arises for 'can', it does not arise for other "possibility" modals. For example, notice that, with the meager context described above, there is a big difference regarding the assertability of 'Roger could play the piano' and of 'Roger can play the piano'. Similarly, there is also no serious issue with regard to 'Roger might play the piano'. 'Could' and 'might' add tentativeness to the assertion that seems called for. There also seems to be no problem for the semantics insofar as it applies to 'is possible'. 'It is possible that Roger plays the piano' rings true relative to the context. But 'Roger can play the piano'? That shouldn't turn out true, especially if Roger is physically or psychologically unsuited for piano playing.

This issue has been frustrating for me, but Wasserman's book has me leaning toward the idea that what is needed is a contextual semantics that includes a distinguishing conditional treatment of 'can' of the sort Wasserman suggests:

(P1**) Necessarily, if someone would fail to do something no matter what she tried, then she cannot do it (p. 122).

This is a suggestion made by Wasserman on behalf of Vihvelin. I find (P1**) as a promising place to start in terms of the conditional treatment.

Speaking of Vihvelin, her thesis is "that no time traveler can kill the baby that in fact is her younger self, given what we ordinarily mean by 'can'" (1996, pp. 316-317). Vihvelin cites Paul Horwich as a defender of a can-kill solution, what she calls the standard reply:

The standard reply . . . goes something like this: Of course the time traveler . . . will not kill the baby who is her younger self . . . But that doesn't mean she can't. (Vihvelin 1996, p. 315)

Vihvelin's doing so is appropriate given what Horwich says about Charles attending the Battle of Hastings: "From the fact that someone did not do something it does not follow that he was not free to do it" (1975, 435). In contrast, it strikes me as odd that Vihvelin (1996, p. 329, fn. 1) also attributes the standard reply to Lewis. I presume that she does so based on some comments by Lewis. He says, "By any ordinary standards of ability, Tim can kill Grandfather," (1976, p. 150, my emphasis) and especially "what, in an ordinary sense, I can do" (1976, p. 151, my emphasis). So, admittedly, Vihvelin fairly highlights an aspect of Lewis's view as holding that, in the ordinary sense of 'can', Tim can kill Gramps. And I can see how this is a useful presentation of Lewis's position for her argumentative purposes.

Nevertheless, I take Lewis's talk of ordinary standards or an ordinary sense to just be a way to identify the ordinary contexts that arise with uses of 'can' in day-to-day dealings, where the possibility of time travel is not even on the table. Simple stuff like:

Hey, can you reach the pencil that fell on the floor?

Sure I can; here it is.

More importantly, we have to keep in mind that the basic semantics only has consequences about the truth of 'can' sentences once a modal base is in place. To me, the fact that Baby Suzy grows up to be Suzy is exactly the kind of fact that we do not ordinarily hold fixed. Lewis's commitment to the semantics does not make him either a can-kill guy or a can't-kill guy.

What is the upshot of this? There is a bit of underappreciation of Lewis's approach in Wasserman's discussion of Vihvelin's views. The pinching case on p. 119 provides a way to make the point. Consider:

(a) If Suzy were to try to kill Baby Suzy, then she would fail.

(b) If Suzy were to try to pinch Baby Suzy, then she would fail.

According to Wasserman, Vihvelin thinks that even in ordinary contexts (a) and (b) come apart (p. 119, note 32) -- (a) is true and (b) is false. As I see it, a natural context for (a) includes the fact that Baby Suzy grows up normally to be Suzy. That is a supposition that is crucial to the description of the scenario and so is likely to be part of the modal base. No canonical story or suppositions are tied to (b), though Vihvelin stipulates that Suzy travels back in time in both cases. We are not, however, told a story of Baby Suzy living a pinch-free life all the way to adulthood. We are not told whether Suzy decided go back in time because Baby Suzy deserved a pinch for some past transgression. My point is that the stories affect the context. So, with parallel background stories, (a) and (b) need not come apart.

I am not sure whether Wasserman was speaking for himself or for Vihvelin when he says about (a) and (b), "Self-defeating acts are paradoxical in a way other past-altering acts are not" (p. 120). Either way, I disagree. Lewis gives a more general way to resolve the past-alteration paradoxes that is not obviously in any serious conflict with Vihvelin's many utterances that turn out true relative to the contexts in which she asserts them. Wasserman also says, "The only disagreement between Lewis and Vihvelin is over whether Suzy's killing Baby Suzy is compatible with the kinds of facts we normally take as relevant in determining what someone can do" (p. 117). That is an odd thing for him to say. Lewis sketches a semantic theory that provides a framework for the truth conditions of 'can' and 'can't' sentences. He is not in disagreement with Vihvelin. For Lewis, there is one specification of truth conditions for 'can' that gives rise to both 'can kill' and 'can't kill' sentences turning out true relative to different contexts. Indeed, it is tempting to think that Vihvelin takes the fact that Baby Suzy grows up to be Adult Suzy as part of the modal base of the contexts from which she asserts the compelling 'can't-kill' sentences.

That all said, Wasserman's book is a significant contribution. There are those of us who focus a good chunk of our research on the paradoxes of time travel for their intrinsic interest, and especially because they are fun to teach. That is contribution enough for me. But, ultimately, from this somewhat esoteric, fun puzzle solving, we also learn more about the rest of metaphysics. The traditional issues of metaphysics: identity-over-time, freedom and determinism, causation, time and space, counterfactuals, personhood, mereology, and so on, all take on a new look when framed by the questions of whether time travel is possible and what time travel is or would be like. Wasserman's book is a wonderful source that spotlights these connections between the paradoxes of time travel and more traditional metaphysical issues.


Cargile, J., 1996. "Some Comments on Fatalism" The Philosophical Quarterly 46, No. 182 January 1996, 1-11.

Gaspar, E., 1887/2012. The Time-Ship: A Chronological Journey. Wesleyan University Press.

Horwich, P., 1975. "On Some Alleged Paradoxes of Time Travel" The Journal of Philosophy 72, 432-444.

Lewis, D., 1976 "The Paradoxes of Time Travel" American Philosophical Quarterly 13, 145-152.

Pitkin, W., 1914. "Time and Pure Activity" Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods 11, 521-526.

Vihvelin, K., 1996. "What a Time Traveler Cannot Do" Philosophical Studies 81, 315-330.

[1] This criticism was first presented to me by Natalja Deng in the question-and-answer period for a presentation at the 2014 Philosophy of Time Society Conference. Later on, I found a parallel challenge in work by James Cargile (1996, 10-11) about Lewis's iconic, 'The ape can't speak Finnish, but I can'.