Parental Obligations: The Duties of a Creator

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Bernard G. Prusak, Parental Obligations: The Duties of a Creator, Routledge, 2013, 162pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415703338.

Reviewed by David Archard, School of Politics, Queen's University Belfast


This book is a valuable addition to what is already a rich philosophical literature on the question of what we owe to those we create. At its core it addresses two big questions: what is the source or explanation of the obligation someone might be argued to have to a new-born child, and what is the extent or scope of that obligation? Bernard Prusak endorses the causal account of parental obligations, whereby these are incurred in consequence of causing a person to exist. This account stands opposed to a voluntarist account whereby parental obligations are incurred as a result of the willing assumption of these obligations. Prusak also thinks that the obligations of a procreator are morally weighty and go significantly beyond what some think is enough, namely assuring the created person of a minimally decent life. I will consider each answer in turn.

The causal account has bite and a certain intuitive obviousness. It seems to follow from a broader and very plausible principle, namely that each of us should bear responsibility for what we bring about. Nevertheless, it is vulnerable to two criticisms. First, it does not, as barely stated, do enough to discriminate between those on the possibly very long list of individuals who played some causal role in the creation of the child. Why, for instance, should the willing provider of sperm (or egg) be thought of as any more of, or any less of, a parent than the fertility clinician who might have laboured long hours to ensure a successful pregnancy? Second, there seems to be what Elizabeth Brake has termed an 'explanatory gap' between the factual statement that 'A caused x to exist' and the normative claim that 'A has parental responsibilities in respect of x', especially when those responsibilities are fully spelled out in the way that we are disposed to do for those whom we identify as parents in our society.

On the problem of not spreading parental responsibility too widely amongst various creators, Prusak has most to say in Chapter 4. Here he responds directly to the charge -- one of 'seeming absurdity' -- that a causal account would count both gamete providers and fertility clinicians as parents for playing a causal role in the creation of a child. In fact Prusak says several things. First, he is prepared to grant that all these individuals do incur 'procreative costs' for doing what they do. Second, we can somehow still make use of the jurisprudential notions of 'primacy' and 'proximity' in identifying those causes of an outcome that may be taken as morally salient and generative of responsibilities. Third, Prusak offers suggestive but brief remarks as to why only some pay these 'procreative costs' in the form of acting as parents. The result is not an entirely clear and coherent response to the basic charge against the causal account.

Prusak wants to avoid the problem of reading moral salience into causal significance, or vice versa -- basically seeing a 'primary and proximate cause' as one that ought to be so regarded. He does seem to think that there is a morally neutral rendering of causal significance that has to do with the place of the cause in the chain that leads to the outcome. Thus, the intending parents who supply gametes 'initiate' a sequence that the clinicians, acting at their behest, simply 'extend'. However, on that account, pioneering clinicians who sought to create the first test-tube baby might be the intending parents, their volunteer donors of gametes merely acting at the behest, and extending the agency of, the clinicians. They would be the modern equivalents of Dr. Frankenstein, and, as such, full parents.

Prusak also thinks that what might matter is not the simple degree of causal influence so much as its significance. Thus there is reference to the 'critical role of genetics in a person's development and constitution' that means that a 'gamete provider has much to answer for' (p. 68). This would imply that 'primacy' of causal role has to be understood, in some part and in some way, in terms of what matters to a created person, namely their identity and nature. Finally, Prusak still allows that assisting clinicians and scientists 'might in fact be the principal candidates for the responsibilities of rearing the resultant child'. They too would 'have much to answer for'. However, Prusak simply deflects the problematic implication of his account by doubting that it would probably be in the child's best interests to be reared by these individuals. This suggests that the distribution of 'procreative costs' incurred by all to only some in the form of parental responsibilities needs considerably more than a causal account can supply.

What is needed here is to be found sketched or implied in Prusak's answer to the question of the scope of parental responsibilities. For he believes that these responsibilities do not amount merely to the provision of a minimally decent existence but extend to an obligation 'to develop a loving parent-child relationship' (p. 4). This is a striking claim, and it is one that is easy to feel great sympathy for. There is, after all, something cold and missing in the orthodox account that -- to put it all too crudely -- does not see anything as morally required other than the assurance that someone somewhere ensures that the child has a life better than non-existence.

The problem is that the account is richly suggestive without always having the argumentative clarity and precision one would want. Prusak makes much, in the crucial Chapter 1, about the unique and 'given' nature of the creator-created relationship. We do not choose who our creators are, and our procreative relation to them cannot be transferred. This much is evidently true. However, the critical question is, Why must this relationship be developed into a loving one of parental care? Is the obligation owed to the child who cannot have any other, or any better, parental relationship than one with their procreators? But the loss of a parental relationship with one's creator is not the loss of the procreative relationship (that is given and fixed for all time); nor need it be the loss of a loving relationship with whosoever is one's guardian. A child may suffer in consequence of not being reared by its creator. However it is always worth distinguishing the source of that loss. It might lie in the severance of a connection that rightly matters greatly to all of us. Or it might lie in the revelation of a disregard for one's existence that is manifested in the creator's indifference to his parental responsibilities. What might hurt is not expressed in the complaint, 'You are my father/mother and that matters to me,' but rather in the protest, 'You are my father/mother and that did not matter to you.' What may be wrong with parental 'abandonment' is what it reveals of the creator's attitude to his creation, and not necessarily the irretrievable loss of a 'given' relationship.

This is not to exonerate or condone the feckless procreator who creates without proper regard for what he creates; nor is it simply to deny what is the case, namely that many adopted or donor conceived children seek out the full narrative of their existence and to make contact with their creators. The crucial issue is whether the given and unique relationship each of us has with our creator must, save at great moral cost, always be developed into the relationship of a child with her guardian. Prusak thinks the answer is affirmative. But his argument does not fully persuade.

Chapters 1, 2, and 4 do most, if not all, of the original moral work of the book. Other chapters provide interesting but rather more supplementary discussions. Chapter 3 discusses Judith Jarvis Thomson's famous pro-abortion argument and does so inasmuch as her account suggests that a prospective mother might abandon her in utero child. It is not, one feels, the discussion of abortion Prusak is most inclined to give. Chapter 5 discusses genetic enhancement and worries what an enhancing parent is likely disposed to think of its child in our current world of 'hyperparenting'. Chapter 6 discusses how we should think not of our own but of others' children, and, thus, what our responsibilities are as a society for those created in our midst.

Throughout Prusak's style is direct, honest, engaging, and forthright. His philosophical commitments spring from a deeply felt concern that creators just do not take sufficiently seriously what it is, in the words of David Velleman, to throw someone into the 'predicament' of existence. This is a welcome corrective to much bioethical orthodoxy that simply fails to take this 'predicament' into proper account. The sub-title of Prusak's book is taken from Mary Shelley's Frankenstein, and it is refreshing to see that tale properly interpreted. The monstrosity of Shelley's cautionary fable does not lie, as its filmic avatars would have us believe, in the physical nature of the Doctor's creation, nor in the egregious wrongfulness of Frankenstein's choice to play God by being a creator, but in the moral failures of a 'parent' to live up to the awesome responsibilities of that generative role. The 'fiend's retaliatory murders are his dreadful response to the cruelty of someone who does not and will not acknowledge a 'creator's duties. Prusak thinks that being merely a good enough parent is not good enough. It is refreshing to hear that stated with the conviction and philosophical sophistication on display in this book.