Parmenides' Grand Deduction: A Logical Reconstruction of the Way of Truth

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Michael V. Wedin, Parmenides' Grand Deduction: A Logical Reconstruction of the Way of Truth, Oxford University Press, 2014, 275pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198715474.

Reviewed by Jenny Bryan, University College London


Michael V. Wedin's stimulating monograph presents a call to arms in defence of Parmenides' status as both 'a severe arbiter of philosophical discourse' (1) and a strict monist who stands apart from and, indeed, rejects the Ionian tradition of natural philosophy. As such, it seeks to resist the increasingly popular desire to rehabilitate Parmenides' significance as a cosmologist engaged in empirical scientific investigation and the kind of qualified monism demanded by such an approach. Wedin is clear from the outset that his reading is offered as a 'logical reconstruction' (2) of Parmenides' arguments and that this concern provides the 'chief constraint' on his interpretation. His impatience with interpreters who do not abide by his interpretative criteria is clear. This critical approach, along with Wedin's commitment to sustained argumentation without much in the way of signposting conclusions or taking stock of them, makes for a challenging read. Nevertheless, the book will be of value to anyone with a serious interest in Parmenides' poem, not least for the degree of disagreement it is likely to provoke. I suspect that few of those committed to a more generous reading of Parmenides' project (and monism) will find themselves convinced by Wedin's defence of what might seem to be unfashionably logical constraints. Nevertheless, anyone seeking to pursue an alternative line will want to address the considerable challenges that Wedin lays down in his critique of recent accounts.

The volume is divided into three sections. In the first ('The Governing Deduction and Parmenides' Master Argument'), Wedin seeks to establish the nature of Parmenides' fundamental and challenging reasoning as found in what he terms the 'Master Argument' of fragments B2, B3 and B6. On Wedin's interpretation, fragments B2 and B3 present Parmenides' 'Governing Deduction', wherein the possibility of inquiry into 'what is not' is eliminated. He considers several of the common complaints made against Parmenides' reasoning, for example that it rests upon an unhappy assumption of equivalence between existence and necessary existence.

Throughout, he is explicit about his willingness to assume a particular logical structure for the argument even where that structure is not necessarily obvious in the text. So, for example, he reads the Law of Excluded Middle (LEM) as central to the distinction set up in fragment B2 between 'what is and cannot not be' and 'what is not and cannot be' and, thus, to the Way of Truth as a whole. As he notes, there is no 'explicit linguistic expression' (14) of LEM in B2. In fact, it seems on the surface to be a modal distinction that is not an instance of LEM. But Wedin points to the occurrence of the clear instance of LEM in fragment B8 (B8.15: 'it is or is not'), which refers back to B2 and thus, he argues, explains the nature (or rather, justifies his own characterisation) of the former distinction. Then, having established the centrality of LEM, Wedin sets himself the task of explaining the 'surprising' fact that the goddess 'does not characterize the paths of inquiry simply as instances of LEM' (15) but rather in modal terms.

Those who are committed to taking what the fragments say as the best evidence of Parmenides' reasoning or, at least, as the best starting point, may be frustrated by this sort of approach. Elsewhere, we can see the way this commitment to logical reconstruction influences Wedin's interpretation. In the final section of Part 1, he briefly addresses the vexed question of the appropriate subject of Parmenides' estin, noting that he is able to 'sidestep this issue by favouring quantified formulae' (79). His interpretation is thus free from (or, at least, minimizes) the constraints of any worries about how the Greek verb itself works (either in Parmenides' verse or in Greek in general).

In Part II, Wedin turns to 'The Deductive Consequences of the Governing Deduction', i.e. the description and limitations on the nature of 'what is', as laid down in fragment B8, arguing that Parmenides is committed to 'ontological monism'. Wedin offers a reconstruction of the arguments of B8 that seeks to correct previous attempts whilst emphasising in particular the central argumentative role of the Governing Deduction throughout this part of the poem. According to Wedin, the Governing Deduction is not only the 'fundamental argument' of Parmenides Way of Truth, 'every other argument in the poem is validated by it' (4). Wedin considers each of the characteristics of 'what is' in turn and reaches the intriguing conclusion that the most significant problem for Parmenides' reasoning lies not the apparent paradox of identifying 'what is not' as an illegitimate object of thought. Rather, the most significant issue is that Parmenides' arguments setting out the nature of 'what is' in B8, and thus in the Governing Deduction itself, seem to entail unwelcome propositions about 'what is not' (which, of course, should have been eliminated).

In the third part, 'Critical Reflections', Wedin presents collected criticism of some particular strands of Parmenidean interpretation alongside an assessment of Plato's reception of Parmenides. In Part I, Wedin defends the Grand Deduction against the charge of being self-defeating on the grounds that it is a second-order proscription of first-order propositions about 'what is not'. In Part III, he takes time to further criticise some alternative attempts to defend Parmenides against the same charge 'if only because they are at odds with my solution' (193). He also offers some explicit criticism of interpretations of fragment B3 as setting up an identity between thinking and being.

Wedin then returns to the question of Parmenides' engagement with the Ionian tradition. In his earlier discussion of the Master argument, Wedin rejected the suggestion that fragment B6 offers any justification for attributing to Parmenides an 'openness to the natural philosophy of his Ionian predecessors' (229). Returning to the issue in Part III, he focuses his attention on the broader arguments of Patricia Curd and John Palmer. He concludes that neither provides a satisfactory explanation of Parmenides' purported interest in cosmology so that 'we are advised, I believe, to abandon the project of harmonizing Parmenides' Eleatic gospels [the Way of Truth and the Way of Opinion]' (248). This reflects Wedin's self-confessed lack of interest in anything beyond the arguments of the Way of Truth, but also highlights a weakness of his account. If he wants to suggest that it is impossible to reconcile these two parts of Parmenides poem, he ought also to be able to explain why the cosmology is part of the poem at all. One of the primary motivations for defending Parmenides' interest in cosmology is the fact that his poem includes a cosmology. Again, the question is whether the interpretation should fit the evidence or the evidence be shaped (and edited) to fit the interpretation.

Wedin is not claiming to offer a full treatment of Parmenides' poem. In fact, he is refreshingly explicit about the limits of his project as exclusively interested in (selections from) the Way of Truth and, in particular, in the logical form of its arguments. He demonstrates an admirable awareness of the worries some might have about his use of first-order predicate logic in reconstructing the arguments of a philosopher working without such a toolkit.

Nevertheless, some may wonder whether such an exclusive focus and narrow approach can genuinely claim to offer a reconstruction of Parmenides' philosophy at all. One might worry that what we are really being offered is an argument with which selected parts of the poem can be rendered compatible. Such a project is perhaps worthwhile in itself, but it may be a stretch to assert that validity should be not only the primary, but, in fact, the sole criterion of interpretation. So, for example, Wedin states in his introduction not only that logical concerns should inform the reconstruction of Parmenides' arguments but also that 'claims about the influence of the epic tradition should not constrain, but rather be constrained by, the structure of [the Way of Truth's] deductions' (5). Wedin seems to want to claim that Parmenides' reasoning can be isolated from its cultural context. This is a provocative suggestion and one for which it would be interesting to read a more thorough defence. Certainly, Wedin is right to criticise those (few) who dismiss the value of logic in reconstructing Parmenides' thought 'with a global sweep of the hand' (8). One might worry, however, that Wedin is simply replacing one dismissive gesture with another by refusing interpretative significance to cultural context, philological concerns, or, indeed, any of the poem beyond fragments B2-8.