Parting Ways: Jewishness and the Critique of Zionism

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Judith Butler, Parting Ways: Jewishness and the Critique of Zionism, Columbia University Press, 2012, 256pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780231146104.

Reviewed by Chaim Gans, Tel Aviv University


In her book Parting Ways: Jewishness and the Critique of Zionism, Judith Butler argues for three main theses. Her first thesis amounts to a complete rejection of Zionism because of how it has affected the Palestinians. According to Butler, Zionism aspires to appropriate the Palestinians' land and disinherit them from it. In her second argument, Butler claims that Zionist ideology must also be rejected because of how it views the Jews. She maintains that Zionist ideology aspires to appropriate Jewish identity and to impose a nationalist interpretation of Judaism on all Jews. However, the major part of the book is devoted to a third thesis that combines the first two. It is in the name of Judaism itself, so Butler argues, that the Zionist movement should be totally rejected.

Butler argues that Jewish history and experience have driven many Jews in the past to construct a Jewish identity for themselves that incorporates the non-Jew. She believes that this experience and history should prompt Jews to do the same today, not only outside Israel and historic Palestine, but also within these geographic and political spaces. She therefore proposes to construct these spaces as binational. By binationalism she does not mean a legal arrangement that allows two nations to live together side by side in one polity under equal conditions, but rather a society and a polity whose citizens are binational at the level of their personality-identity. That is, they are either Jews who have in some sense made Palestinianism a part of their identity, or Palestinians who have in some sense incorporated a diasporic identity, which, according to Butler, is the major characteristic of Jewish identity. It is this specific type of binationalism that makes her book philosophically interesting and novel. She wants Israel/Palestine to be a political entity that is inhabited by Jews and Palestinians who first have deconstructed their particular mono-national identities and then reconstructed themselves with binational identities. The political entity that would emerge as a consequence of this individual deconstruction and reconstruction would therefore be post-national.

Butler's proposal is radical on two levels. Firstly, she turns the elementary moral requirement that we be considerate of the other while preserving our own identity into a requirement to make the other a part of our identities while, at least to some degree, annulling our previous selves. Secondly, she takes the basic requirement imposed by political morality on countries whose populations are binational to reflect this binationality in their institutional structure one step further, requiring individuals living in such countries to acquire binational identities.

I will postpone my judgment of this suggestion and continue the descriptive part of this review in order to explain how Butler argues for her proposal. She does not do this by means of an independent argument, but rather constructs her argumentation by engaging with texts produced by two groups of intellectual luminaries. The members of one group are Arabs -- namely, Edward Said and Mahmood Darwish -- who represent the Other with whom the Israeli Jew must cohabitate within his own soul if he wishes to live in Israel/Palestine. She has chosen Said and Darwish because they already acknowledged the necessity to cohabitate with the Jews. Said and Darwish try to convince the Jews that they ought to live with the Arab as an Other, because Palestinian-Arab identity comprises part of the Jew's hybrid identity. Butler illustrates the centrality and availability of Jewish-Arab hybridity in the first chapter of her book by analyzing an essay by Said in which he analyzes Freud's essay on Moses, the Jewish prophet who was actually an Egyptian. The first chapter of the book is itself an exercise in Jewish-Arab hybridity. Butler is an intellectual who considers her Jewishness to be a dominant part of her identity. She undertakes an analysis of the work of another intellectual (Said) whose Arab identity was central for him. He in turn analyzes the work of another intellectual Jew (Freud), who analyzes a prophet (a kind of intellectual) who was an Arab Jew (Moses).

The idea of a hybrid Jewish identity that this chapter and the whole book stresses is inspired not only by Said's essay on Freud's Moses, but also by the work of two Israeli post-Zionist intellectuals, Amnon Raz-Krakotzkin and Yehuda Shenhav. Raz-Krakotzkin's seminal essay "Exile within Sovereignty" argues for an exilic interpretation of the Israeli-Jewish existence. He has certainly earned Butler's acknowledgement of his influence on her in the second footnote of her book. The sociologist Yehuda Shenhav argues for the centrality of Jewish-Arab hybridity in the Jewish identity of the non-Ashkenazi Jew (and the need to criticize the Zionist movement for its Eurocentric marginalization of the non-Ashkenazi Jew). However, these Israeli intellectuals seem to play the role of prompters for Butler. Despite the centrality of their ideas in her book, they seem to have been relegated to the footnotes.

In addition to the Arab luminaries, the second group that Butler deals with extensively throughout the book is a group of Jewish intellectuals who have acquired canonical status in Western culture. Chapter 2 is devoted to what Butler regards as a contradiction within Emanuel Levinas's writings pertaining to Israel on the one hand, and Judaism on the other. In Chapter 3 she discusses Walter Benjamin's critique of violence. In Chapter 4, Butler compares the meaning of Messianic politics in Benjamin and other writers. The fifth chapter deals with Arendt's objections to the nation state and the issue of whether Jewishness must be reinterpreted in the light of Zionism. Chapter 6 mainly analyzes Arendt's controversial book Eichmann in Jerusalem and its implications regarding cohabitation with the Arabs. In Chapter 7, Butler addresses Primo Levi's depiction of the Shoa, his public criticism of several Israeli policies, and Israel's general exploitation of the Shoa in order to silence any criticisms of its policies. The major part of the final chapter is dedicated to the Palestinian refugees and the conditions they live under, and Israel's duty to acknowledge their right of return. According to Butler, the Palestinian right of return entails that it is Israel's duty to dismantle itself as a Jewish state. At the end of this chapter, which is also the end of the book, Butler again discusses Said and Darwish.

As I have already mentioned, all these very rich discussions are intended to lead the reader to the conclusion that in view of Jewish experience and history, the appropriate interpretation of Jewish identity is a diasporic interpretation that requires Jews to integrate the identities of those other groups that they live with within a given country into their own personality-identity. In Israel/Palestine they ought to support a political entity whose Jewish citizens have all integrated a Palestinian component into their identities while its Palestinian citizens do the corresponding thing. Following Said and Darwish, it is the Palestinians and the Jews' exilic existence that must define their identity.

Butler's theory of what constitutes the desirable Jewish identity is diametrically opposed to that of Zionism. According to the Zionist theory, Jews ought to regard their identity as an ethno-national identity, and take part in the realization of their right to national self-determination. One problem with these two theories is their claim to totality. Surely Jewish history and experience is rich enough to support both the ethno-national and the diasporic interpretations of Jewish identity and politics. They both seem to be within the range of what Rawls calls "reasonable pluralism" either as abstractions of past experience or as strategies for future existence. The fact that they are just two very reasonable interpretations of Jewish experience that could coexist defeats the claim to totality made by each of them.

Butler's proposal has one additional weakness. As mentioned above, she believes that Jewish history and experience not only requires that -- as required by universal morality -- Jews be considerate of others, but also entails that Jews should integrate the other group's identity into their own personality-identity. It is not at all clear what this means. However, let us suppose that it is similar to how one thinks of one's relationship with one's spouse or partner. For many people, their partner or spouse is an extension of their own self, and not merely someone towards whom they need to be considerate. Is it reasonable to expect all Jews to have an attitude of this type towards the Palestinians? Isn't it enough to insist that they treat them with equal respect and concern while preserving their distinct Jewish ethno-national identity? And isn't binationality on the political and legal level sufficient for this purpose? Do we really need binationality on the personality-identity level for the purpose of taming the kind of Zionism currently practiced by the modern state of Israel?

In the opening paragraph of Chapter 1, Butler compares the binationalism she argues for with pacifism:

Although it is commonly said that a one-state solution and an ideal of binationalism are impractical goals  . . .  it is equally true that a world in which no one held out for a one-state solution and no one thought anymore about binationalism would be a radically impoverished world. I take it that we might say the same about pacifism. It might be discredited as lacking all Realpolitik, but would any of us want to live in a world in which pacifists no longer existed? What kind of world that would be?

It must be stressed that the problem with pacifism is not just one of Realpolitik. One need not be a Hobbesian in order to believe that it is not only an unreasonable position from a pragmatic point of view but also from a moral point of view. But the claim that pacifism is a morally unreasonable position does not entail that there should be no pacifists in the world. However, their role in our world should be the one that John Rawls defined for them in his theory of justice:

Even though [the pacifist's] views are not altogether sound, the warnings and protests that a pacifist is disposed to express may have the result that on balance the principles of justice are more rather than less secure. Pacifism as a natural departure from the correct doctrine conceivably compensates for the weakness of men in living up to their professions (TJ 370-371).

The above quote of Butler's might indicate that she is perhaps sensitive to the possibility that her theory of Jewish identity need not apply to all Jews or all Israeli Jews. It need only apply to those Jews who have made it their mission to embrace a lifestyle that would serve to warn other Jews against the essentialist and chauvinist interpretations of Zionism that have dominated Israeli policies in the last few decades. In other words, Israeli and non-Israeli Jews in Israel who accept Butler's anti-Zionist interpretation of Jewish identity could have a role similar to that of pacifists in a Rawlsian society. However, it is unreasonable to expect Butler's interpretation of Jewish identity to be accepted by all Jews. This is even more so the case with regard to her proposal pertaining to institutional arrangements which would turn Israel/Palestine into a binational state in the sense that it would be populated by individuals with binational personality-identities.

The institutional arrangements for Israel/Palestine must be binational, and there are many variations of binational arrangements. That is, Israel/Palestine could be partitioned into two binational states. Each of the two groups would enjoy majority-based political dominance in one of these two binational states (as opposed to the constitutionally-entrenched dominant status of the sort that Jews now enjoy in Israel).  Israel/Palestine could exist as one binational state with two territorial autonomies, or as one binational state without separate territorial autonomies. Within such institutional arrangements, Jews who favor the Zionist interpretation of Jewish identity could live together with Jews who favor the diasporic identity. The major requirement is that the institutional arrangements would allow for equality between Palestinians and Jews in Israel/Palestine and bring the constitutionally entrenched dominance of Jews over the Palestinians to an end. For that purpose, there is no need for Butler's unsound radicalism, which seems to me both psychologically unattainable for most people and politically unnecessary in order to achieve the goal Butler's radicalism purports to achieve: equal respect and concern at both the individual and collective level for both Jews and Palestinians in Israel/Palestine.

The argument that Butler makes against Zionism on the basis of her interpretation of Jewish experience and history takes up the main part of her book and somehow makes the book merit being described as philosophical. However, as mentioned at the opening paragraph of this review, apart from arguing against Zionism on behalf of Judaism itself, Butler voices general anti-Zionist accusations which one could hardly call philosophical. In the introduction, as well as in various other parts, she is in effect begging her own questions. She argues for a total rejection of Zionism by identifying it with colonial policies of uprooting of entire populations, and of confiscating land (for example, pages 2, 32, 213-214). Butler's identification of Zionism with these policies obviously entails the need to reject Zionist ideology. There is no need to invoke philosophical argumentation or distinctions in order to achieve this goal.

What supports and excuses Butler's view of Zionism as having a "structural commitment to state violence against minorities" is the fact that since the 1970s, Zionist policies cannot but be identified with the most abhorrent interpretations of this ideology and with this structural commitment. However, before 1967, especially in the late 1940s and early 1950s, Zionism as a whole could reasonably claim to be justified by the necessity created by the fact that the Jews had suffered from persecution in Europe culminating in the Holocaust and by the Arabs' total rejection of any form of Zionism. However, in view of the Israeli victory in 1967, any such claims to necessity can no longer be taken seriously. Therefore, since the 1967 war, Israel's actions and policies can only be explained by resorting to those interpretations of the Zionist ideology that make it morally unacceptable. However, this does not entail that Zionism as a whole (since its initial inception in the 19th century) cannot be interpreted in ways that would make it morally acceptable.

Butler is aware that such interpretations exist and that there were Zionists who acted in accordance with these interpretations. (See pages 18-19, for example). Hence, in order to reject Israeli policies of the last four decades, it is not necessary to reject all the possible interpretations of Zionism. The demand that Israel act according to morally acceptable interpretations of Zionism would be sufficient.

I think that Butler's argument ignores some basic distinctions. First, she does not distinguish between Zionism as a political theory of the Jewish people and Zionism as a historical movement of the Jewish people. Second, with regard to Zionism as a political theory, she does not make distinctions between its different conceptions. With regard to Zionism as a historical movement, she does not distinguish between the question of the justifiability of the movement as a whole and the justifiability of specific policies or actions undertaken by the movement in the course of its history. This distinction is analogous to the distinction between ius ad bellum and ius in bello­, or the distinction between justifying a practice and justifying particular acts under it.

Resorting to these distinctions would have enabled Butler to reach a more balanced judgment of Zionism and perhaps to present a less exotic theory for the Jewish personality-identity and the desirable political arrangements for Israel/Palestine. The fact that she does not do this creates a problem not only from the theoretical point of view, but also from the practical perspective. A total rejection of Zionism is conceived by most Israeli Jews and perhaps many non-Israeli Jews as a threat to the meaning of their Jewish existence. Their opposition to such total rejections of Zionism in effect often drives them to indiscriminately reject any criticism of Israel and the way Zionism has been realized in the last forty years. It therefore seems to me that Butler's total rejection of Zionism is not only theoretically erroneous, but also damaging in practice for those humanistic causes that she pursues in her book.