Pascal: Reasoning and Belief

Pascal Reasoning And Belief

Michael Moriarty, Pascal: Reasoning and Belief, Oxford University Press, 2021, 432pp., $77.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198849117.

Reviewed by William Wood, University of Oxford


Those of us who study Pascal must walk a very fine line. We must not downplay the alien and off-putting character of Pascal’s thought, steeped as it is in a severe Augustinianism that seems unpalatable to contemporary sensibilities. At the same time, Pascal has never lacked for readers, and it is easy to see why. So we must also ensure that his keen observations on the human condition resonate with all the force they deserve. The fact that Pascal’s primary philosophical and religious text, the Pensées, comes to us in an unfinished, fragmentary form makes the task even harder. Pascal is one of the great Christian rhetoricians of any age, but too often his commentators fall into the trap of imagining that he chose every word of the Pensées with deliberation and care.

Michael Moriarty has become one of the great interpreters of Pascal in the anglophone world. His previous monographs Early Modern French Thought: The Age of Suspicion (2003) and Fallen Nature, Fallen Selves (2006) unlocked Pascal for non-specialist readers, not just because of Moriarty’s own sensitive readings of Pascal’s texts, but because he also furnished them with a reliable and accessible guide to the best French scholarship on Pascal. Now, with Pascal: Reasoning and Belief, Moriarty turns to Pascal’s religious thought and especially to the Christian apology that likely would have emerged from the Pensées. This is how he himself presents the book’s aim:

I try to explain not only what Pascal said, and why he said it, but ask also whether what he says has any claim to be true. To be more precise, while attempting to reconstruct his argument for Christian belief, I comment on how far it, or parts of it, might be relevant or convincing to a modern reader. (vii)

These three aims are quite different, and they do not stand or fall together. It is one thing to try to understand what Pascal said and why he said it, another thing to determine whether contemporary readers will be convinced by what Pascal said, and another thing again to determine whether they ought to be convinced, because what Pascal says is true. Moriarty gives us much more of the first, significantly less of the second, and hardly any of the third. Despite his (slight) protestations to the contrary, Moriarty’s book is really an example of sympathetic exegesis rather than an exercise in constructive philosophy. This is not a criticism: English speaking readers of Pascal need a philosophically literate, historically informed account of exactly what Pascal took himself to be doing in the Pensées, and how he might have completed his unfinished apology. Non-specialist readers also need a way into the best French scholarship on Pascal’s apologetic strategy. With this book, we now have both.

To provide a sense of the way Moriarty proceeds, I will consider two topics of special interest to contemporary philosophers of religion. I begin with Moriarty’s treatment of Pascal’s famous wager. As customarily understood, Pascal’s wager argues that it is rational to bet that Christianity is true, and thus to become a Christian, since the expected value of even a slight chance at infinite happiness in heaven massively swamps any finite loss that would arise should it turn out that Christianity is false and God does not exist.

Pascal’s wager has spawned countless philosophical reconstructions and rebuttals. This result is truly remarkable, given that at the level of the text itself—the actual words that Pascal wrote on the page—it is not clear exactly what the “wager argument” is, or to whom it would have been addressed. Nor is it clear where, or to what purpose, the wager would have appeared in the final draft of the Pensées, assuming that it did so appear. Did Pascal mean the wager as a standalone argument that it is practically rational to believe in God? Or does the wager depend on conclusions established elsewhere in the larger apology? There is little scholarly consensus on any of these questions.

Moriarty is a reliable guide. He introduces us to some of the key debates among Pascal scholars about the wager’s intended audience and its eventual placement in the Pensées. Yet he does not allow himself to get bogged down in the minutiae of these debates, and maintains a light touch throughout. His historical chops are on full display: few non-specialists will know that “Pascal’s” wager had as many as ten close precursors among seventeenth-century French apologists, and that more remote precursors include Plato and al-Ghazali; yet even so, Moriarty is careful to stress that Pascal “made the idea his own and developed it more fully than any previous writer” (359).

He begins with an extended prose summary of the dialogical argument of the wager fragment, as found in L418–26/S680, to which Pascal gave the title “Infinity—Nothing.”[1] Moriarty treats the wager fragment more like a literary text than like an exercise in decision theory. This close attention to the text pays off. I was pleased to see that Moriarty’s summary includes two points that are often overlooked by philosophical commentators: Pascal’s own argument in the wager fragment is entirely positive; he never posits damnation for the unbeliever if there is a God. At the same time, he does posit greater happiness in this life for the sincere Christian, even if there is no God (366, 369). These points may have no implications for decision theoretic reconstructions of the wager, but they are important for understanding Pascal’s own apologetic strategy.

Moriarty next introduces and addresses nine objections. His main concern is to present responses that Pascal himself might have given, rather than to contribute to contemporary philosophical debates. The longest such response concerns the “many gods” objection to the wager. In brief, the many gods objection asserts that if the wager argument goes through, then the same reasoning could also be used to support rational belief in any religion that promises an eternal reward.

According to Moriarty, Pascal would not be troubled by this objection. He would first insist that the wager is aimed at people for whom Christianity and atheism are the only live options. Pascal’s own wager, then, was meant as a binary choice. Second, as Moriarty correctly points out, Pascal actually has considerably more to say about whether Christianity is a better choice than other religions. When presented with the many gods objection, Pascal could therefore appeal to the historical and evidential proofs that feature in the rest of the Pensées (377). This second point is especially noteworthy. Present-day readers often fail to notice that throughout the Pensées, Pascal offers many historical and evidential “proofs” that are meant to vindicate Christianity over other religions, as well as over unbelief. These proofs are no longer persuasive to most of us, since they assume the veracity of various Christian miracle claims, and treat the Biblical record as literal history. But they are there—and they comprise much more of the text of the Pensées than the so-called wager.

Interestingly, Moriarty holds that the wager is more vulnerable to the “many gods objection” if it is understood as a stand-alone argument. He seems to assume—following the great Pascal scholar Philippe Sellier—that a stand-alone wager would come early in the Pensées, and so could not rely on Pascal’s historical and anthropological arguments that Christianity is true and promises real happiness. Yet there are other possibilities that Moriarty does not sufficiently consider. Pascal could have intended the wager as a stand-alone argument, in the sense of “an independently sound and persuasive line of reasoning” even if he planned to include it later in the Pensées, after the historical and anthropological sections. Alternatively, Pascal could have intended the wager argument as a very early salvo designed primarily to induce his audience to keep reading, even if the argument on its own did not yet persuade them that it is rational to become a Christian.

I now turn to the problem of divine hiddenness. Moriarty’s treatment of the problem of divine hiddenness also illustrates the way he engages with contemporary philosophical critics of Pascal. Christian scripture and tradition make the puzzling claim that God “hides himself” from us (Isaiah 45:15). This claim is puzzling because we might expect that a perfect God of love would reveal his existence to everyone, or at least to everyone who sincerely seeks him; yet some people seek God earnestly but without success.

J.L. Schellenberg (2006, 2015) appeals to this intuition to construct an a-theological argument from divine hiddenness. According to Schellenberg, a perfectly loving God would ensure that his existence is sufficiently obvious to everyone, with the result that reasonable nonbelief in God should be impossible. Yet reasonable non-belief in God is possible, according to Schellenberg, from which we can conclude by modus tollens that a perfectly loving God does not exist.

Pascal is one of the great Christian theorists of the hidden God, and so he attracts the attention of present-day philosophers like Schellenberg. Moriarty briefly presents Schellenberg’s hiddenness argument, as developed in dialogue with Pascal. He then probes for weaknesses or misunderstandings in Schellenberg’s treatment of Pascal (274–79). Moriarty’s concern is not to dispel the problem of divine hiddenness absolutely, or even really to vindicate Pascal contra Schellenberg. Instead, his concern is primarily textual and historical: first to show where Schellenberg has misunderstood Pascal, and then to determine what Pascal would say to Schellenberg’s criticisms.

According to Moriarty, Pascal’s response would be twofold. First, he would “reject the presupposition that God’s manifestations must be widespread in time and space” (277, citing L448/S690). On the contrary, the fact that God has occasionally made himself known at certain points throughout human history suffices to show that he exists, according to Pascal; there is no further need for overwhelmingly obvious evidence available to anyone. Second, Pascal would question Schellenberg’s “assumption that we can know enough about the divine nature to be sure how God would behave—and in particular to take the absence of the behavior we would expect as sufficient reason . . . to deny the existence of God” (277).

Moriarty’s two responses are convincing. Yet there is a third response available to Pascal, which Moriarty does not take seriously enough. In my view, Pascal could also deny that reasonable non-belief exists at all. That is, for Pascal, perhaps all non-belief is finally culpable. Moriarty considers this possibility up to a point (276) but does not take it as far as Pascal himself would. On my own reading, because of Pascal’s very severe doctrine of the Fall and its cognitive consequences, he would hold that those who seek God earnestly yet fail to find God are still in the grips of pervasive self-deception (Wood 2013). Moriarty considers this option, but labels it “extreme” (277, n 26). And so it is, but when it comes to his interpretation of the Fall, Pascal is nothing if not extreme. (In general, Moriarty is very good on Pascal’s account of the Fall [164–88] though he might also have connected that account more explicitly to Pascal’s treatment of other aspects of human subjectivity, including the imagination, custom and habit, and the habituated body.)

I have chosen to focus on the wager and divine hiddenness because these are the topics that are likely to be of greatest interest to contemporary philosophers. Yet Moriarty is at his strongest when he departs altogether from the narrow philosophical idiom of “objections and replies,” and instead holistically considers what kind of text the Pensées really is, and what it is really for. According to Moriarty, reading the Pensées is—by design—fundamentally a transformative, pedagogical encounter with Pascal’s words. As we read, whether we realize it or not, we are not only instructed but changed. “Pascal is not simply propounding a view of the human condition; he is training the reader to think in a particular way: to see unexpected connections between facts of experience, to see the hidden logic behind apparently irrational behavior patterns and attitudes . . .” (339). In other words, through the force of his written words, Pascal is trying to “create” in his readers the “receptivity” required for sympathy to the Christian message. That is exactly right.

As with Pascal, so with Moriarty. Moriarty aims to create in present-day readers the receptivity required to read Pascal with sympathy. He achieves this aim admirably, with erudition and finesse.


Pascal, Blaise, Pensées, ed. and trans. Roger Ariew, Hackett, 2005

Pascal, Blaise, Pensées, ed. and trans. A.J. Krailsheimer, Penguin, 1995

Moriarty, Michael, Early Modern French Thought: The Age of Suspicion, Oxford University Press, 2003

Moriarty, Michael, Fallen Nature, Fallen Selves, Oxford University Press, 2006

Schellenberg, J. L., Divine Hiddenness and Human Reason, Cornell University Press, 2006 [1993]

Schellenberg, J. L., The Hiddenness Argument: Philosophy’s New Challenge to Belief in God, Oxford University Press, 2015

Wood, William, Blaise Pascal on Duplicity, Sin, and the Fall: The Secret Instinct, Oxford University Press, 2013

[1] I cite the Pensées by fragment number from A. J. Krailsheimer’s translation (New York: Penguin Books, 1995), which uses the Lafuma numbering scheme. In addition to the Lafuma number (“L”), I also cite each fragment by Sellier number (“S”), which is used in both Roger Ariew’s translation (Indianapolis, Ind.: Hackett, 2005) and in Honor Levi’s abridged edn, Pensées and Other Writings (New York: OUP, 1995).