Passionate Engines: What Emotions Reveal about Mind and Artificial Intelligence

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DeLancey, Craig, Passionate Engines: What Emotions Reveal about Mind and Artificial Intelligence, Oxford University Press, 2002, xvii + 254 pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-514271-3.

Reviewed by George Graham, University of Alabama, Birmingham


Human emotional and affective life is so rich, naturally expressive and circumstantially variegated, that any attempt to philosophically theorize about it may appear, at first thought, ridiculous. The phenomena may seem to resist distinctively philosophical analysis. But philosophers on emotion, is this truly ridiculous? For three reasons, I believe, it is not.

In the first place, emotions are difficult to manage and often destructive. Philosophers are in the business of identifying how not to ruin lives. In the second place, emotions, can, in their essential complexity, be fecund bases from which to draw lessons about virtues and vices, means between extremes, the emotional modification of behavior – indignation, shame, gratitude, caring, love. To ruminate about such matters has been part of the philosophical enterprise since Plato and Aristotle.

In the third place, consider the fact that a lot of analytic philosophy of mind in the middle and later part of the last century worried in an a priori way about the concepts of mind, action, belief, desire, and so on. Where did it take us? Arguably, not very far. Accusatory voices from the sciences and from philosophers who admire science prodded philosophers of mind to appreciate that although conceptual inquiry, of some sort, is inescapable and science can profit from it, it is woefully incomplete and parochial unless tethered to scientific models and theories of relevant empirical data.

With the new century, the shift in appreciation is complete. Philosophers of mind now commune with scientists, and both populations are better for it. Real minds, not mere or only concepts, are central to the discipline of philosophy of mind. Emotions are among the data. Emotions are part of real minds.

Craig DeLancey’s book is a contribution to the philosophical analysis of real minds. To notice merely the main title of this book is to suspect, perhaps, that DeLancey writes in the traditions of those worried about destructive emotions or emotional virtues and vices. ‘Passionate engines’ suggests a machine running out of control or too steamy and hot to effectively compute. The subtitle, while less simmering, more accurately reports. DeLancey seeks convergence in our understanding of emotion and real minds between the best that various sciences have to offer and the best that philosophers have said. DeLancey is not trying to tell us how to keep from being emotionally destroyed or how to navigate between emotional extremes. He seeks to address a set of questions about mentality via exploration of emotion.

The easiest question to state at the outset is whether the following thesis is true: Emotional behavior is neither identical to nor a proper part of emotion.

Call this theis the behavioral separability thesis (BST). Emotion is one thing. Behavior is something else entirely. False, says DeLancey. Moreover BST is so importantly false, for DeLancey, that we might ask whether he is a behaviorist about emotion. He’s not. He labels himself an ‘affect program theorist’ about ‘basic emotion’. The coupling of affect program theory with the very idea of basic emotion forms the book’s conceptual core and explains how DeLancey rejects BST without embracing behaviorism.

Here are the overall approach and themes of the book.

Emotions are too many and various to be studied all at once. So, subtract and simplify. Focus on basic emotions. Learn from them about mind and mentality. Basic emotions include such emotions as fear and anger, among a few others. What makes an emotion basic?

A basic emotion:

  • Appears in different cultures in similar behavioral manifestations or displays.
  • Is shared with human beings by several different species of non-human animals, where, again, it is similar in display.
  • Is or appears to be adaptive – in the sense that it contributes or certainly seems to contribute to inclusive fitness.
  • Is, prototypically, cognitively unsophisticated. Non-language users possess the capacity for it.
  • Contributes to behavioral autonomy, to plasticity of behavior, free of crude pushes and pulls from the environment.
  • Is associated with—strongly supervenes on—a unique physiology or set of physiological changes.
  • Serves as a platform for or ingredient in other (non-basic) emotions.

Consider anger. Anger occurs in different cultures in similar modes of display. It is shared with some non-human animals, seems, in general, to be adaptive, does not require cognitive complexity, and possesses its own, as it were, center of physiological gravity. It also underlies the development of various other emotions such as feelings of moral resentment and revenge. So, anger is a basic emotion.

Now add affect program theory. Affect program theory – developed by scientists such as Silvan Tomkins, Paul Ekman, and others – answers several questions about basic emotions and in a manner that has implications for numerous philosophic issues. The questions include whether emotions are dispositions or occurrences, social constructs or culture-independent responses, essentially conscious or not. The issues for which the theory, for DeLancey, has implications will be mentioned momentarily.

Here is the theory. DeLancey introduces it in the first chapter and then re-introduces and refines it throughout the book.

Affect program theory says that basic emotions have a temporal character. They take place over time (in certain cases, a few moments perhaps). So, they are not dispositions; they are occurrences. (For reasons of expository convenience I use my own terminology to identify the temporal stages of emotion.)

The temporal character of basic emotion has a three-stage structure. The structure consists of cross-culturally more or less uniform and biologically natural conditions of elicitation or onset. Call this the First or Input Stage (IS). It also consists of uniform and natural motor or behavioral activity. Call this the Third or Output Stage (OS). There is also a second or Middle Stage (MS). MS consists of representations of the input and output, the biology, chemistry, and general neural circuitry which operate in regulating the response to input and the orchestration of output and, finally, the ‘extended body’ (the brain’s maps or representations of and input from the body). In certain cases, MS representations are quite sophisticated (and may involve decision, cultural influences, and the like). However, in the main, MS representations are “not best described … as constituted out of propositional attitudes” (p. 214). They are not very or truly conceptual or statement-like.

MS is ‘spatially’ complex. It is tiered or hierarchical, rising from the neurochemical to the representational, and from the limbic to the neocortical. The package of temporal stages and hierarchical complexity means that each of the basic emotions helps to form a kind of package or dynamic program, designed by Mother Nature in her distal wisdom.

The non-conceptuality of MS as well as the cross-cultural character of the IS and OS stages mean that basic emotions are not social constructs or cultural artifacts. The issue for DeLancey of whether emotions are essentially conscious is more elusive. Much depends on what is meant by ‘conscious’.

Imagine, says DeLancey, an “affective invert” (pp. 162-3). This would be a quasi-human being who, say, in the case of a basic emotion such as anger, passed through the IS, MS, and OS of anger, but was actually not angry (but loving and affectionate). DeLancey claims that it is ‘grossly implausible’ that such a being could exist. This is because the very idea of a basic emotion is inseparable from the MS-cognitive-architecture and OS-behavior that are stages in basic emotion. If the architecture and behavior are of a type (that of anger), the basic emotion must be of the same type (anger) as well.

An affective invert would be conceivable if we equated an emotion like anger with a conscious feeling of anger and allowed that such a feeling could occur in a fleeting moment (before OS). DeLancey refuses to equate emotion with feeling (pp. 12-18). Feelings do not accord with the orientation of affect program theory towards basic emotion. Besides which, he says, if there is any sort of consciousness in emotion, this is something functional rather than a mere feeling. Consciousness works within the MS to help to produce OS. Partly for this reason, DeLancey calls the sort of consciousness that may take place in emotion “working consciousness” (p. 12). It’s not phenomenal. There is nothing it is like to possess the working consciousness of someone who is angry.

So, here is DeLancey’s answer to the question of whether basic emotions are essentially conscious. No, they are not. Consciousness, on occasion, and perhaps even prototypically, can be part of MS. However the consciousness which can be part of basic emotion is not phenomenal consciousness. It’s an introspective workspace that helps to produce—and is what it is, in part, because it helps to produce – the final stage of basic emotion, OS.

DeLancey extracts or tries to extract a host of philosophical morals or lessons from his theoretical core (of basic emotion and affect program theory). Space prohibits their discussion in this review, but I shall mention them. They include the

  • Falsity of any and all intellectualist theories of basic emotion.
  • Falsity of interpretationism about basic emotion.
  • Falsity of social constructivism about basic emotion.
  • Falsity of the willing-suspension-of-disbelief theory of emoting for fictions.
  • Inapplicability of the computational theory of mind to basic emotion.
  • Poverty or disutility of the concept of desire in explaining human behavior.
  • Importance of robotics to the future of artificial intelligence research.
  • Utility of the concept of homeostasis in identifying the function of (working) consciousness.
  • Utility of a broad notion of rationality in explaining whether or how basic emotions can be rational.

The list is partial. It conveys the considerable scope and ambition of the book.

The idea that basic emotion includes behavior as a proper part is sure to provoke discussion. The basis for such a view is complex. DeLancey’s view is not behaviorism or at least not peripheralism. MS and not just IS and OS are essential to basic emotion. DeLancey allows also that behavior can be suppressed. Behavior is essential to the distal etiology of basic emotions (and to their evolution in human and various non-human animals). But ‘proper part’ does not mean that a basic emotion requires behavioral display (OS) in each and every occurrence. Anger as a basic emotion type cannot occur without behavior but an instance or token of anger may be behavior-less (provided there is a mechanism of suppression).

Equally provocative is DeLancey’s construal of the representational or intentional content of basic emotion. One way in which to describe his construal is to say that a basic emotion is a kind of perception-cum-motivation. The object of perception is, paradigmatically, quite rigidly represented. In a case of fear, it’s a snake, say, and not a long blade of grass; and the representation of the snake normally is of a snake, not of a blade of grass that is mistaken for a snake. Such fixation does not permit cognitive penetration by background beliefs or higher-order convictions, at least not in prototypical cases, and certainly not in cases of non-human animals and young children.. Some creatures with basic emotions have no such complex background states.

DeLancey coins a concept to pick out the eliciting or intentional object of basic emotion: concretum (p. 89). A concretum is a represented object (either actual or imagined) that serves as the object at which a basic emotion, prototypically, is directed. In the case of fear, it is that which is feared. Part of what DeLancey means by speaking of a concretum is that the intentional object of a basic emotion (e.g. the snake) does not need to be represented in a propositional attitude. The representations in MS prototypically are not attitudes. DeLancey wields his notion of representing a concretum against ‘intellectualist’ (he calls them ‘cognitivist’) theories of (basic) emotion. These are theories that classify emotions as attitudes or as possessed of conceptually enriched intentional contents.

DeLancey’s critique of intellectualism (cognitivism) brings a welcome deflation to a literature that thus far often has made possessing emotions seem the province of graduates of universities: angrily clenched fists are intellectual sorts of things. It’s one measure of the attempted realism of this book that DeLancey recognizes that emotion and background cognition need not mix. He is trying to examine real emotions in real minds.

I have a shepherd’s concern for phenomenal consciousness in emotion that DeLancey does not share. One of the most critical conceptions in his view of basic emotion seems to me to be unmotivated and deserving of more discussion. He invites us to conceive of basic emotions (or affects, as he prefers sometimes to call them, partly for this reason) absent what it is or feels like to undergo them. He describes conscious states in basic emotions as representations of our extended body (such as the sensation of a pit in one’s stomach or fever on one’s brow, etc.). The objection that I am inclined to make is that DeLancey does not take the phenomenology of basic emotion in the human case seriously enough. The intentional content of a basic emotion may be conceptually humble, but the phenomenology can be quite rich and strikingly salient.

Consider a person for whom absolutely nothing of his body is represented. He has no visual, tactile, or sensory experience of any kind. His ‘feelings’, when he has them, are quite ‘intellectual’. When angry he does not sense that his fist is clenched. He feels an intense, harsh judgment about the object of his anger. “The idiot!” he says to himself. “He should rot!” The scope of such a person’s phenomenology is not constituted, let us suppose, by representations of his extended body. He has no such representations, or they are turned off.

My intuitions tell me that it makes perfect sense to speak of this imagined person both as angry (I said ‘when angry’) and as feeling angry. However I doubt whether we may include such an individual in DeLancey’s universe of possible subjects of basic emotions. Apparently we should not.

I cannot make an attempt here to defend the ultimate relevance of phenomenology to emotion and to the intentionality of basic emotion. What needs pointing out is only that DeLancey seems to subtract phenomenology from basic emotion. He would protest this, showing, as he does, sympathy for a hypothesis about homeostatic intensity to help to explain just what the phenomenology of basic emotion is. However I find his discussion of homeostatic intensity and something he calls “a system-based teleological theory of consciousness”, which takes up the 10th chapter in this book of 13 chapters, the least helpful and the one and only truly obscure chapter in the book.

Though I am troubled by his treatment of phenomenology (which I have, admittedly, not fully characterized above), DeLancey’s attention to basic emotion rather than emotion in general is entirely wise and fruitful. The following seems true to me.

Some emotions are culturally fluid, conceptually enriched, and present the world to us as a highly ambiguous place in which to live. However, there are other emotions, call them ‘basic’, which form a small, etiologically special class among emotions in general and are found across cultures and in many sorts of non-human animals. Their conceptual content is, often, paltry, and the world they present to us is a highly determinate place, filled with snakes and snares. The medium of mind/brain suffers certain structural rigidities or limitations – dictated in part by evolution—in its capacity to represent the world in such emotions. This does not cripple us. Snakes may not always be dangerous. Nonetheless they are wisely avoided. We don’t know where they’ve been. However the limitations can hurt as well and help to explain why emotions are often difficult to control.

DeLancey’s book is a multi-faceted, subtle treatment of basic emotion, as just roughly characterized. It takes the rough edges of that characterization and refines them, extracting penetrating and provocative lessons from basic emotions and affect program theory. It is both ambitious in scope and written in a modest and probing style, so that even when DeLancey provokes he does not alienate. Passionate Engines is a genuinely valuable contribution to the philosophical literature on emotion.