Passions and Persuasion in Aristotle's Rhetoric

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Jamie Dow, Passions and Persuasion in Aristotle's Rhetoric, Oxford University Press, 2015, 248pp., $66.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198716266.

Reviewed by Eugene Garver, Saint John’s University


Jamie Dow has produced a clearly written account of a central issue in Aristotle's Rhetoric, and has done so in a way that makes it almost impossible for the reader to get lost. While much of the material was previously published, the seams don't show. The Introduction begins by presenting the "Principal Claims of the Book." "The principal claim defended in this book is that, for Aristotle in the Rhetoric, arousing the passions of others can amount to giving them proper grounds for conviction, and hence a skill in doing so is properly part of an expertise in rhetoric" (p. 1). Much turns on making sense of the proper grounds of conviction. "Aristotle has a consistent view of rhetoric: as an expertise in producing 'proofs' (pisteis) -- understood as 'proper grounds for conviction' -- for the speaker's audience." To speak about proper grounds for convictions means that there is something normative about the Rhetoric, even though Dow rejects imputing an "ethics of rhetoric" to Aristotle. Proper grounds must be proper by norms of the art of rhetoric itself, not some external moral criterion. He finds those proper grounds in the political function of rhetoric. Next, he claims that "If the arousal of the passions is part of rhetoric, thus understood, Aristotle must hold, second, a particular view of the passions: he must think that they are representational states, in which the subject takes things to be the way they are represented" (1). He divides the book into ten chapters organized into three main parts; the first five chapters show how the proper grounds for conviction rest on the political function of rhetoric, contributing towards good judgments in law courts and political assemblies (9); the next two show how the arousal of emotions can constitute a proof, and defends that interpretation against Aristotle's explicit statements that seem to reject appeals to the passions; and the final three erect a theory of the passions as they operate in the Rhetoric.

The first chapter gives the background for the Rhetoric in alternative contemporary views of the handbook writers on the one hand and Plato on the other. The second chapter, the longest in the book, turns to the Rhetoric itself to show how Aristotle's conception of rhetoric can be, like Plato and unlike the sophists, normative, but with the difference that for Plato rhetoric aims at "the production of virtue in the souls of listeners; for Aristotle, it is well-founded judgments in the listeners" (34). The third chapter turns from explicating Aristotle's idea to showing how one might, and how Aristotle does, defend it. Dow raises the crucial question, in what is rhetorical expertise an expertise? He argues that Aristotle distinguishes himself from the handbook writers not by advocating a moral approach to rhetoric in opposition to their neutrality, but by showing rhetoric's function in the state.

There are some obvious things he might have pointed out about irrelevant speaking -- that it produces miscarriages of justice, vindicating the guilty and condemning the innocent, and that it produces poor political decisions. Instead, he mentions none of these and bases his objections to irrelevant speaking on a careful analysis of the proper roles of speaker and juror/decision-maker in the state (69).

The emphasis on proper roles of speaker and hearer is critical. When Aristotle says that irrelevant appeals "warp the juror" like "someone warping the ruler he/she is about to use," (1354a24-26), Dow comments that this removes the possibility that when "the juror's verdict is . . . in the orator's favor, this confirms the correctness of the orator's position in just the same way that a ruler can confirm the straightness of the carpenter's handiwork" (71). Not only is restrained and methodical rhetoric of benefit to the state, and not only does it not harm the judges by manipulating them, but its practice rebounds to the benefit of the practitioner by letting him know when he's right and when wrong. "The orator's success itself requires the good deliberation of the judge" (74); rhetoric, such as Gorgias advertises, that overwhelms the judges and deprives them of the power of judgment does not, as it seems to, empower the orator. The success of the speaker depends on the success of the judges.

Although the method of deliberative and judicial rhetoric is the same, and although deliberative subjects are finer and more important to the state than private transactions, [the handbook writers] have nothing to say about the former, and all try to describe the art of speaking in lawcourts, because it is less serviceable to speak of things outside the subject in deliberative situations.

Placing deliberation at the center of the art of rhetoric is the missing move that strengthens Dow's case that rhetoric's normative dimension comes from its role in the state. Neglect of the enthymeme and concentration on judicial rhetoric go together. Similarly, in arguing that pistis has a normative dimension, he could have mentioned the two definitions of the function of rhetoric, which emphasize the difference between that function, finding the available means of persuasion, and actually persuading a given audience. (Just as pistis is normative, so too is the "available" (endechomenon) means of persuasion, and endoxon, reputable premises as well.)

In Chapter 4 Dow asks, Is Aristotle's Rhetoric about rhetoric? "Aristotle's view of rhetoric as all about proofs makes sense if rhetoric is an expertise in promoting good public judgments, but why should we think that this is what rhetoric is? Has he merely changed the subject?" Aristotle says that the handbook writers had nothing to say about the enthymeme, which is the body of persuasion (pistis), so one could say that according to Aristotle, the handbook writers were not about rhetoric. Why couldn't they return the favor and claim that Aristotle was talking about something else, maybe dialectic, but not rhetoric? Dow's answer:

In any genuine attempt to persuade, speakers themselves seem to aim not merely at getting people to their point of view (in most cases, speakers would not consider that coercive means would do just as well), but at convincing their listeners in a way that endorses the correctness of their case (83).

Dow could add the definition of rhetoric at the end of I.1, and then again at the beginning of I.2, which distinguishes between convincing an audience and finding the available means of persuasion; it is the latter that is the function of the art of rhetoric (see p. 87). He could also draw a connection between the endorsing he sees here and the issue he raises in the last part of the book, on whether the emotions involve endorsement.

Chapter 5, "The Interpretation of Aristotle's Rhetoric," is only six pages long. Summarizing the first part of the book, he says that his interpretation maintains the "moral neutrality of Aristotelian rhetoric" while instead finding it "conforming to epistemic norms (governing standards of inference, and relevance) in the production of proper grounds for conviction" (89). He sees this as consistent with the older tradition of seeing rhetoric as the counterpart of dialectic rather than classifying it alongside the Ethics and Politics. But his own argument, especially in chapters 2 and 3, had argued for the legitimacy of rhetoric on the grounds of its role in the polis and in political judgment. On p. 48 he does just that: "What it is to be a good proof [pistis] is (at least in part) a matter of its credentials as a demonstration." Aristotle calls rhetoric the counterpart of dialectic, but also says that it is the offshoot of both dialectic and politics, so the choice between seeing it as part of the organon, which Dow claims was how the Rhetoric was conceived until the 13th century, and its classification with ethics and politics since then, is not straightforward. Moreover, there is a third way of placing the Rhetoric, which also has some textual grounds and ancient provenance, if not as strong as its relation to dialectic and politics. That is to see the Rhetoric as somehow a companion to the Poetics. There are cross-references between the two works and some mutual illumination. But that is complaining that Dow didn't write the book he didn't write.

Part 2 concerns the question that is the title of chapter 6: "How Can Emotion-Arousal Provide Proof?" He begins by considering the third source of proof in addition to argument and emotion, persuading through character or êthos. He concludes:

Proofs through the argument itself involve the listener consciously believing the premises, believing that the epistemic good standing of the conclusion is enhanced by the reputability of the premises, and then coming to believe the conclusion on that basis. As we are now in a position to see, character-proofs (and, I will hope to show, emotion-proofs) will simply be variants on this standard case (99).

Although when asked "Why did you think Smith guilty," we don't answer: "Because I was afraid of him," it does make sense to say that I think him guilty because I think him dangerous (104-5). This account depends on the emotions having representational content and involving an affirming of that content, and Dow will show how Aristotle supposes just that.

This simple account of how emotional appeals can be a legitimate part of rhetoric, though, runs up against Aristotle's apparent condemnation of emotional appeals in the opening chapter of the Rhetoric. Chapter 7 replies to that objection. Dow's central, and I think original, insight is clearly stated on p. 111:

My central claim is that where Aristotle's text has 'slander and pity, anger and similar passions of the soul (1354a16-17), this is not a list of passions, but a list of activities. He is referring to the activity of diabolê, and the activities advocated by handbook writers for using their set-piece 'recipes' for emotion-arousal -- recipes used to generate sections in a speech (often in the introduction). These aimed to affect the state of mind of the listener, but were unconnected to the specific subject matter at issue.

These set-pieces have a use in the introduction and peroration of a speech, but not in the narration or "the pisteis section" (113). There is a difference between undoing the effect of one's opponent's diabolê, slander, and refuting his arguments. Teaching these set-pieces is equivalent to the handbook writers neglecting the enthymeme. The set-pieces also are primarily useful in judicial rhetoric, which is essentially agonistic, and not in deliberative oratory, which Aristotle places at the center of the art of rhetoric.

In the final three chapters Dow looks again at how Aristotle must understand the passions for them to play the role in rhetoric Dow has found in the first two sections of the book. "The view defended here may be summarized very simply. Aristotle thinks that passions are pleasures and pains, where these are understood as states with representational contents, and where these contents are taken by the subject to be the way things actually are" (131). I thought that that had been established in chapter 6, but now he focuses in chapter 8 on the definition of the passions in Rhetoric II.1 and the treatment of individual passions in the next eleven chapters. The final two chapters move from explicating Aristotle's understanding of the passions to philosophically defending it. While the earlier chapters focused on the role the passions play in "verdict formation," here the focus is on just how "they involve pleasure and pain" (180). While it seems clear that an emotion involves representational content -- I am angry at Fred for having insulted me -- to say that pleasure and pain have such content is a harder claim, and that is what chapter 9 argues for. The final chapter focuses on the relation between phantasia and the passions.

I see two weaknesses in the book, and they are related. First, Dow makes the Rhetoric out to be more polemical than it is, even in the first three chapters on which he concentrates. That Aristotle's thinking was shaped by certain debates -- something that Dow shows persuasively and in detail -- does not mean that he saw himself as taking part in those debates. He concedes that "in the treatise as a whole, Aristotle shows awareness of some other theorists and practitioners of rhetoric, [but] he does not seem to have them in view when he argues for his general position" (11). But Dow often organizes his analysis of the Rhetoric in terms of whom he takes Aristotle to be arguing against: Chapter 1 is called "Rhetoric and the State -- Aristotle and His Predecessors", Chapter 4 is called "Aristotle against His Rivals," and he often sees polemics and "allusions" which he uses to explain the text. If the Rhetoric is as polemical as Dow thinks, he should explain why the Rhetoric differs from the rest of Aristotle's works in this way (unless he thinks that they are similarly agonistic).

And second, Dow shows how Aristotle develops an understanding of the nature of rhetorical expertise, but I wish he had gone on to show how this understanding shapes the rest of the Rhetoric. To take a fairly easy example, it should be possible to move from Dow's presentation of the first three chapters to showing how the declared superiority of deliberative over judicial rhetoric manifests itself in the treatments of the different kinds of rhetoric in the rest of Book I. To take another example, Dow explicates the difference between real and apparent enthymemes and notes that Aristotle says that a single faculty deals with both. Late in Book II Aristotle devotes a chapter to apparent enthymemes. It is difficult to formulate a general criterion for what counts as an apparent as opposed to a real enthymeme or as opposed to something that doesn't even appear to be an enthymeme. It would be helpful if Dow could show how the initial distinction of real and apparent enthymemes bore fruit in this more detailed discussion or showed why no such derivation of a criterion is possible.

Dow notes but does not discuss the fact that while Aristotle engages with other teachers of rhetoric, he barely mentions its practitioners, apart from Isocrates. Especially if the criterion for propriety of the proper grounds for conviction is political, I wonder why Aristotle does not discuss statesmen who used rhetoric for better or worse in assemblies, or practitioners such as Demosthenes. None of the handbook writers was a citizen of Athens, which is I think relevant to seeing the criterion for excellence as political. (Nor, of course, was Aristotle.) The remark in Rhetoric I.1 that good laws forbid speakers from speaking outside the subject, on which Dow leans, has its counterpart in the dicastic oath, which Aeschines and Demosthenes used in their orations as a topic for argument. Extant speeches, too, are full of the sorts of appeals that Aristotle thought would be excluded by good laws. The Poetics, by contrast, gives examples from and judgments on tragedies, but there is nothing about other theories of poetry, not even Plato's, and Socrates not only argues with the handbook writers but denies the status of Pericles and argues too with prominent demagogues such as Critias and Alcibiades. I would like to hear Dow's account of why Aristotle is not interested in particular orators. His question, is the Rhetoric about rhetoric, would have greater bite if he compared the Rhetoric not only to the handbook writers but to rhetorical practice.

A final criticism, although I'm not sure whether this is a criticism of Dow or of Aristotle. Dow refers several times to Aristotle's optimism. "Aristotle is optimistic about the extent to which popular views track the truth (1355a14-18)" (p. 60). "Aristotle's conviction of the beneficial effects of rhetoric seems to rest upon an optimistic assessment of the tendencies of humans to believe the truth" (66; see too 78. 224). This attitude is present at the beginning of the Rhetoric. Rhetoric and dialectic, he says, are both concerned with opposites. "Of course, the underlying facts are not equally good in each case, but true and better ones are by nature always more productive of good syllogisms and, in a word, more persuasive" (1355a31-32). Calling it optimism makes this attitude adventitious and not part of the argument itself. If the claim that truth is more persuasive than falsity is not part of Aristotle's argument, what Dow calls epistemic norms have no basis. If true, this is a dagger in the heart of the Rhetoric.