Paternalism: Theory and Practice

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Christian Coons and Michael Weber (eds.), Paternalism: Theory and Practice, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 283 pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107691964.

Reviewed by Edward Erwin, University of Miami


This excellent collection links paternalism to a wide variety of topics including criminalization, self-sovereignty, autonomy, moral environmentalism, suicide prevention, the Hart-Rawls principle of fairness, paternalism in economics, choice architecture, psychology and paternalism, libertarian paternalism, voluntary enslavement, and school choice.

In their Introduction, the editors discuss recent trends. One is a growing consensus in favor of paternalism. Related to this is another: increased agreement that the perceived evils of paternalism, including coercion, removal of choice, and disregard of the target's evaluative perspective, need not be present in instances of paternalism. Given these trends, it is not surprising that the main issue they discuss is what, if anything, makes paternalism, morally problematic? Their conclusion (p. 24) is that it remains unclear what precisely, if anything, is wrong with paternalism.

What is paternalism? Many think of paternalistic acts and policies as those that restrict the liberty of individuals for their own good. Whether or not this captures the essence of paternalism, unclarities surface once obvious philosophical questions are asked, as Gerald Dworkin demonstrates in his very good essay. For an act to be paternalistic is it the actual or potential reasons for the liberty restriction that matter?

If the actual reasons are determinative, then a problem arises where there are multiple reasons for the paternalism. If only one person restricts the liberty of another, we might rely on the reason the agent acted on, but when laws are passed, there are many legislators, often with different motives. Two thirds of the Florida legislature may vote for a law requiring me to wear a helmet while riding a motorcycle for my own protection, but one third may simply be trying to reduce costs to the taxpayers who pay for the treatment of severe head injuries. In determining whether the law is paternalistic, which motives count?

Instead of appealing to actual motivating reasons, we might bring in potential reasons. How might this go? One possibility is to say that an act or law is paternalistic exactly if the only reason that truly justifies the liberty restriction is a paternalistic one. It would then seem that all paternalistic acts are justifiable; those in which the paternalist justifications fail would not be paternalistic.

There are other ways to deal with these problems. One is to give a conceptual analysis and be guided by it in identifying paternalism. This raises a different problem. Dworkin states eight separate analyses, one of which is his, and his list could be enlarged. How do we know which is the correct account? Quite often, the only argument that is made rests on intuitions, but whose intuitions besides those of the proponent of the account?

In discussing her own highly regarded definition of paternalism, Seana Shiffrin discusses a park ranger who refuses to let someone go up a dangerous path, not because the visitor to the park might die, but because his grief-stricken spouse might suffer if he were to have an accident. Such a refusal, Shiffrin says, also seems paternalist, but not to Dworkin, who says the exact opposite. This problem of conflicting intuitions arises generally in defending philosophical definitions of paternalism.

If there is no way to know which analysis is correct, what should we do? We could give up attempts to defend necessary and sufficient conditions for an act or policy being paternalistic and stipulate that such and such is what a given writer means by "paternalism" and then move on to the moral, psychological, and economic issues. This is what Peter de Marneffe does in his interesting essay on paternalism and self-sovereignty. His goal is to explain how it is possible to respect self-sovereignty without embracing Mill's harm principle or objecting to all paternalism. He proceeds by articulating a theory of self-sovereignty consisting of two principles, the prohibition and opportunity principles (p. 58), and then appeals to the principles in arguing that the paternalistic criminalization of drug use and prostitution violates self-sovereignty, but paternalistic non-legalization might not.

Almost all of the essayists defend some form of paternalism, but some take a harder line than others. Danny Scoccia defends a version of hard paternalism. Someone advocating soft paternalism may allow paternalistic interference in the lives of others but not beyond the point that it violates the person's right to autonomy. Hard paternalism, as advocated by Scoccia, permits the crossing of this line drawn by Joel Feinberg, who argued that an individual's right to be autonomous is absolute. Scoccia challenges Feinberg's arguments and concludes that this right is not absolute.

Steven Wall also considers issues about autonomy and paternalism in his paper on moral environmentalism. The moral environmentalist, according to Wall (p. 94), supports the use of law to create or preserve an emotional and cultural climate that favors some forms of life over others. Without some specification of what forms of life are being talked about, this is fairly benign. But Wall adds, more provocatively, that moral environmentalism permits the criminalization of so-called "victimless crimes" if non-criminalization makes it more likely that the perpetrators will lead morally less good lives than if they did not have access to these options. Wall tries to make a presumptive case for moral environmentalism and then argues that considerations of autonomy fail to defeat this presumptive case.

Kant, Mill, and Rawls play a key role in some of these papers. Michael Cholbi relies on a Kantian view to justify paternalism in a limited number of cases, one being suicide prevention and even then only in some cases. Intervention to prevent suicide, he holds, is permissible when we are instrumentally irrational due to distortions of rationality, but not when such irrationality rests on rational error (p. 125). Cholbi explains this crucial distinction between different sources of irrationality on p. 129. Roughly, the distinction is between a rational agent irrationally choosing inadequate means to her chosen end and an irrational agent doing the same. The rational agent may suffer from no cognitive defect or mental disorder but merely make a mistake of practical rationality, a rational error. In contrast, the irrational agent's deliberation is distorted by cognitive defects, mental illness, or false beliefs.

Lawrence Alexander considers the arguments of Mill and others against selling oneself into slavery. He concludes that the case against voluntary enslavement has yet to be successfully made.

What is known as the Hart-Rawls principle of fairness stipulates that when people voluntarily restrict their own liberty under certain conditions in ways necessary to yield advantages for all, they have a right to similar acquiescence on the part of those who have benefitted from their submission. One important objection to the principle is that forcing people to comply would be wrongfully paternalistic. Richard Arneson defends a modified version of the principle against this anti-paternalistic objection as well as other objections.

Jamie Kelly takes up the influential argument of Cass Sunstein and Richard Thaler that empirical evidence from behavioral economics and psychology supports libertarian paternalism. Kelly argues that their empirical evidence is neutral between libertarian-paternalism, utilitarianism, and a justice-based approach; consequently, their view is not supported by this evidence.

In a nuanced and, in my view, well argued paper, J. S. Blumenthal-Barby considers the Sunstein-Thaler view that "choice architects" should learn about the various ways to influence choices and then work to design environments that promote choices that make people better off. She examines two claims that are the basis for choice architecture: 1) it makes people better off; and 2) it does so in a way that is entirely compatible with individual liberty. Blumenthal-Barby raises problems for both claims, but in the end (p. 196) agrees that choice architecture can improve people's choices while preserving their liberty, but to establish the soundness of this claim many nuances and clarifications, and more and better empirical evidence about decisional processes, are needed.

Douglas Husak discusses paternalism as it arises in penal law. First, he sets out a theory of criminalization consisting of six constraints that must be satisfied before a penal law may be enacted and enforced (pp. 42-43). To illustrate the kind of theory being proposed, the first principle requires that criminal laws must be designed to prevent harm, and the second requires that the conduct proscribed be wrongful. Next, he employs his theory to argue that paternalistic rationales will justify state punishments in no more than a handful of cases (p. 52). Husak does allow, however, that paternalism in law may be defensible when it enhances rather than diminishes the conditions of autonomy (p. 40).

Sigal Ben-Porath advocates a "structured paternalism", so called apparently because on her view certain choices we make in a social environment are structured for us and we have little control over them. Beyond this claim, structured paternalism holds that paternalistic interventions concerning, for example, school choice, are justified when they advance freedom and promote civic equality as a central democratic value.

In an interesting paper on paternalism and economics, Daniel Haybron and Anna Alexandrova argue against the "minimalist" position that happiness-driven economics (HDE) is objectionable because it is paternalistic. They argue that some forms of HDE are paternalistic but others are not and that minimalism itself is guilty of what they call "inattentive paternalism", a paternalism resulting from being insufficiently attentive to people's attitudes concerning their own affairs.

The title of Jeremy Blumenthal's paper is "A Psychological Defense of Paternalism". If he were to make good on what the title suggests, the defense would be philosophically interesting just because there is a promise to provide an empirical defense of a moral doctrine. In fact, however, he attempts something less ambitious. Blumenthal appeals to empirical data to knock down certain objections to paternalism, but as to the latter's support, he offers nothing more than the claim that if the objections are answered, a prima facie case for it exists (p. 215). This does not amount to a psychological argument for paternalism; the prima facie case is left unsupported.

There are many subtle and seemingly powerful arguments in this book. Yet, if we look beneath the surface, we will find deep difficulties.

Most if not all of the moral arguments for or against paternalism depend on an appeal to the author's intuitions -- what seems to be so, or what looks plausible. Perhaps this is inevitable and allowable, but the large gap between seeming to be so and being so should at least be noted. Arguments that look impressive may collapse when the intuitions fail to provide the required support, which may be all of the time.

Apart from questions about the evidential value of intuitions about the morality of paternalism, there is the issue of the appeal to moral theories, such as those of Kant or Rawls, or anti-utilitarianism. How many of these theories have been established as true? Where they have not been proven, how can they reasonably be relied on as premises of an argument?

More reflection is needed when discussions of paternalism presuppose theories of welfare. Liberty and autonomy may well be intrinsically valuable, but it does not follow that they are valuable for any particular individual. Not everyone values liberty and autonomy to the same degree or benefits equally from their possession. For some, given their desires, the benefits of liberty and autonomy are minimal compared to the benefits of being taken care of. Desire-satisfaction theories that imply that certain intrinsic goods, including liberty and autonomy, may be of minimal benefit to some people may be wrong, but they need to be considered.

There has been an attempt in recent years to inject into paternalism debates an appeal to empirical studies, a good development for sure if it is an empirical thesis that is at issue. Yet, when philosophers say "Studies show . . . ", they are generally referring to studies with very small sample sizes, even counting replications, given the very large number of agents the hypotheses are about. Even if sample sizes were adequate, without knowing more about the empirical evidence for the validity of the measures, the adequacy of the controls, and the treatment of contrary evidence, we can often say no more than "Recent empirical work seems to show such and such, but a lot more needs to said about the particulars of the studies before the appeal to them can be trusted".