Pathologies of Reason: On the Legacy of Critical Theory

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Axel Honneth, Pathologies of Reason: On the Legacy of Critical Theory, James Ingram (tr.), Columbia University Press, 2009, 222pp., $29.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780231146265.

Reviewed by David Owen, University of Southampton


In this remarkably subtle volume of essays, Axel Honneth reflects on the tradition of which he is a distinguished contemporary representative, moving between historically guided reflection on systematic issues concerning the form and viability of the project of critical theory and insightful studies of aspects of the work of thinkers who inform this project (Kant and Freud) or directly contribute to it (Adorno, Benjamin, Franz Neumann, Alexander Mitscherlich, Albrecht Wellmer). Given the dialectical character of Honneth's engagement with the tradition of Critical Theory, one should not distinguish sharply between these two activities, and although the essays gathered in this volume can be read as free-standing pieces, they are more valuably engaged as a self-conscious reflection by Honneth on the conditions of his own activity as a Critical Theorist, that is, on the demands of the tradition within which he works and the contemporary requirements of maintaining this tradition. These essays, thus, reflect the working through of the relationship of inheritance and originality within which Honneth's intellectual activity is situated.

I will approach this collection initially in terms of the significance of the forms of self-reflection exhibited here for Honneth's own philosophical project (focusing on chapters 2-3 and the appendix) before turning to two more specific aspects, namely, Honneth's concern with psychoanalysis and its relationship to democratic politics (chapters 7-9) and his sympathetic reconstructions of the contemporary import of aspects of Adorno's work (chapters 5-6 with a side glance at chapter 10).

In doing so, I will leave aside the opening essay of this volume, 'The Irreducibility of Progress: Kant's account of the relationship between morality and history', which discerns an 'unofficial' argument in Kant which, in contrast to Kant's official arguments concerning our entitlement to a (providential) reconstruction of history as purpose-driven based on the needs of theoretical or practical reason, presents human history as marked by a conflict-ridden learning process which, though often violently interrupted, can never be fully halted. (Honneth is clear that this route pursued by Habermas probably represents the only way in which Kant's philosophy of history can be made relevant for contemporary philosophy, but it is also apparent that Honneth takes this Kantian thesis as a supplement, rather than an alternative, to the basic Hegelian form of Critical Theory's philosophical engagement with history.) I will also leave aside the most historically contextualised essay, 'Saving the Sacred with a Philosophy of History: On Benjamin's "Critique of Violence"', which is perhaps the one chapter that does not appear to play a positive role in relation to Honneth's tack of philosophically reflecting on the history of Critical Theory as a way of locating the requirements placed on his own philosophical activity.

The type of philosophical 'working through' exhibited by this collection is itself a feature of Critical Theory's dual inheritance of Hegel and Freud to which Honneth is acutely sensitive. In both cases, we are presented with models of a distinctive form of self-reflective activity in which the activity of recollecting how we have become what we are, motivated by an experience of obscurity or unintelligibility, takes the form of a perspicuous re-articulation of what we are that, when successfully incorporated into one's subjectivity, constitutes the overcoming of the source of obscurity. This distinctive kind of self-reflection is, on Honneth's account, basic to Critical Theory:

In contrast to the approaches that have achieved dominance today, Critical Theory must couple the critique of social injustice with an explanation of the processes that obscure that injustice. For only when one can convince the addressees by means of such an explanatory analysis that they can be deceived about the real character of their social conditions can the wrongfulness of those conditions be publicly demonstrated with some prospect of their being accepted. Because a relationship of cause and effect is assumed to obtain between social injustice and the absence of any negative reaction to it, normative criticism in Critical Theory has to be complemented by an element of historical explanation. A historical process of the deformation of reason must causally explain the failure of a rational universal, a failure that constitutes the social pathology of the present. The explanation must at the same time make intelligible the de-thematization of social injustice in public discussion. (p. 30)

While this pattern of self-reflection is philosophically initiated by Hegel, its post-Idealist development as Critical Theory is structured through, on the one hand, the appropriation of Marx and Weber (the latter often read through the lens provided by the early Lukacs) and, on the other hand, through Freud, in the tradition that runs from Horkheimer to Habermas and Honneth himself. Yet it should be noted that Honneth's engagement in this process of 'working through' with respect to the tradition of Critical Theory marks a significant difference between the place of such reflection in his work and that of his immediate predecessor in Frankfurt, Habermas, in that Honneth is both a more subtle and sensitive interlocutor of the intellectual inheritance bequeathed to him and through this engagement accomplishes an articulation of the demands placed on the development of this tradition. There is a clear sense here that more is at stake for Honneth's rather more Hegelian understanding of the requirements of his own project in the recuperation of the tradition of Critical Theory than is the case for the more Kantian stance of Habermas.

This Hegelian stress emerges again in Chapter 2, 'A Social Pathology of Reason: On the intellectual legacy of Critical Theory', which provides the systematic heart of this volume, when Honneth discusses the conflictual character of the actualisation of reason as a learning process and acknowledges that Habermas 'is the first [of the Frankfurt School theorists] to achieve a systematic breakdown of the various learning processes, an analysis he grounds on the variety of ways in which human beings relate to the world through their linguistic practice.' (p. 32). However, as Honneth immediately notes:

the gain in differentiation comes at the cost of no longer being able to consider historical growth in rationality together with those social conflicts which, following Weber's sociology of domination, were more clearly before the eyes of early Critical Theory. In Habermas' work, we find a gulf between the dimension that, for instance, Bourdieu investigated in the cultural formation of monopolies, and rational learning processes -- a gulf whose presence is fundamentally inconsistent with the original concerns of the critical tradition. (p. 32)

This is a telling criticism, yet Honneth also knows that a contemporary Critical Theory requires an account of the differentiation of rationality such as Habermas provides. It is in the face of such theoretical dilemmas that Honneth finds the starting point for his own account of Critical Theory:

In contrast to the Habermasian approach, which carries out such a differentiation on the basis of the structural particularities of human language, there may be a superior conception that ties the aspects of social rationalization (in an internal realist sense) more closely to the ability of socially established values to disclose problems. In that case, invariant values of linguistic communication would not reveal the direction in which the rationalization of social knowledge is to proceed. Rather, the historically produced values present in social spheres of meaning would play this role. (p. 32-3)

It is, of course, just such an approach which Honneth has sought to develop in his work on struggles for recognition as motivated by a concern to reconcile Habermas' advance with 'the original concerns of the critical tradition'. It is, however, worth noting that Honneth now recognises the need for Critical Theory to include a genealogical dimension (a point already present in Adorno) and, in an interesting appendix essay on the figure of the social critic, the role of rhetoric in effective social criticism.

Taking a more Hegelian approach also leads Honneth to take the task of social philosophy as a distinctive enterprise concerned with pathologies of reason in a more psychoanalytic direction than Habermas' later work exhibits, not least to address the concerns just outlined. Three essays in this collection addressing Freud, Neumann and Mitscherlich help to exhibit Honneth's reasons for, and the shape of, his appropriation of psychoanalysis.

His discussion of Freud in Chapter 7 focuses on the issue of freedom. In part this concerns Freud's understanding of freedom in terms of a process of recollection through which the bringing into articulate expression of the unconscious sources of compulsions enables the overcoming of such compulsions. However, Honneth is concerned in particular to stress a further point, namely, that Freud 'has to impute to every person, whether healthy or ill, an interest in pressing for the production of a will that is as free as possible':

Returning to contemplate one's own process of formation, which Freud also ascribes to the normal subject as a reaction to confronting irrational wishes, is simultaneously the performance and expression of this interest. We turn back to our life history in such moments because we want our willing to be free of elements that are unintelligible to us and not willed. (p. 141)

Honneth suggests that this is a 'risky step' for Freud 'for which he lacks a reliable justification' but I would have thought that it is rather an example of justification from 'best explanation'. More curiously, Honneth goes on to point out that Freud's concept of self-relation is formally similar to Kierkegaard's:

Neither for him nor for Kierkegaard is attaining freedom of the will the result of a one-off, momentarily performed act of becoming aware. We do not become assured of our individual freedom through an instantaneous reflection that shows that our endeavours and wishes are expressions only of our will. For such self-assurance, what is needed is, rather, a protracted and strenuous process of working through and remembering in which we attempt, against persistent resistance, to appropriate retrospectively the previous separated elements of our will. (p. 144-5)

The reason that this is curious is not so much that it is wrong but that it almost willfully elides the rather more pertinent source of Freud's positing of a basic interest in freedom and the view of such freedom in terms of an ongoing process of overcoming 'persistent resistance', namely, Nietzsche. Freud's basic interest is a straight borrowing of Nietzsche's view that human brings are characterised by 'an instinct for freedom (in my language: will to power)' as he puts it in the second essay of the On Genealogy of Morals, and Freud's understanding of freedom as a self-relation comprised of shaping oneself through overcoming resistances is formally identical to Nietzsche's own conception of freedom (as consistently stated from The Gay Science to Twilight of the Idols). Honneth's failure to appreciate the Nietzschean roots of the features of Freud with which he is concerned means he misses the opportunity to use those resources in helping to clarify the relationship between the cognitive and affective dimensions of the process of self-overcoming, a point which has been the focus of considerable attention in recent years with respect to the Genealogy and that has considerable salience for Honneth's own project.

The essays on Neumann and Mitscherlich both address the significance of psychoanalysis for reflection on the freedom from (unnecessary or autonomy-impairing) anxiety as an element in identifying the preconditions of a (healthy) democratic constitutional state. Honneth credits Neumann's final work 'Anxiety and Politics' with opening up this research agenda but argues that Neumann's own orthodox Freudian account cannot get to grips with the question it poses. Honneth's grounds for this critique rely on, first, his view that object-relations theory provides a more compelling account of neurotic anxiety than classical Freudian theory and, second, that Neumann's account is too closely tailored to the rise of Nazism in Germany which both helps to conceal the weakness of its classical Freudian apparatus and limits its ability to ground a more general account.

By contrast, Honneth finds in Mitscherlich's investigations of 'inner freedom' resources for a psychoanalytically informed democratic theory. What Honneth finds in Mitscherlich is both a helpful point and the suggestion of a helpful approach to addressing it. The helpful point is Mitscherlich's suggestion that the capacity of citizens to cope with the demands of a pluralistic democratic culture involves cultivating an attitude of tolerance towards themselves which finds expression as the experience of 'inner freedom'. The suggestion of a helpful approach is given by Mitscherlich's distinction between three aspects or stages of the process of achieving and sustaining this practical relation to self: first, articulation -- a process of working through in relation to one's drives in which we give self-conscious linguistic expression to them; second, understanding -- the acknowledgment of 'the frightening discordant wishes as part of one's own biographically developed personality' (p. 164); third, the incorporation of this articulation of this understanding into one's conduct.

While, clearly, this provides Honneth with a route for addressing the limitations he identified in Neumann's work, it remains the case that much remains to be done to give this substantive expression. It is unclear, for example, how such a process relates to Honneth's understanding of democracy as reflexive cooperation or what such a therapeutic process might practically involve; however, the focus on 'inner tolerance' does provide a route through which Honneth may also connect to Foucault's late work on care of the self and Cavell's reflections on moral perfectionism (both of which Honneth touched on in his Tanner Lectures on reification) as well as possibly some aspects of William Connolly's emphasis on relaxing the relationship (or logic) of identity and difference -- a theme often stressed by theorists of agonistic democracy.

The final theme in this collection of essays to which I want to pay attention is Honneth's relationship to Adorno, a theme addressed in two chapters on Adorno concerning Adorno's social theory ('A Physiognomy of the Capitalist Form of Life') and philosophical approach ('Performing Justice: Adorno's Introduction to Negative Dialectics'), but also present in his laudatory reflections on Wellmer in the final chapter 'Dissonances of Communicative Reason'. In the first of these essays, Honneth provides a reading of Adorno's recourse to the notion of 'physiognomy' which shows how figures like 'the culture industry', 'organisation' or 'the half-educated' adapt Weber's idea of ideal-typical analysis through recourse to Nietzsche and Freud on affect and suffering. The contrast between the sympathetic subtlety of Honneth's reading in which Adorno's recourse to exaggeration or, perhaps better, accentuation becomes key for disclosing the forms of damage characteristic of the capitalist form of life and the utter reductionism that was manifest in Habermas' reading of the Dialectic of Enlightenment in his The Philosophical Discourses of Modernity could hardly be more marked.

This concern with close attention to Adorno's work continues in the following essay in which Honneth attempts to reconstruct the point of Adorno's long and seemingly disjointed introduction to Negative Dialectics. This is a quite brilliant essay which I can't do justice to in this review. Suffice it to say that Honneth is clear on the contestable presuppositions of Adorno's turn to negative dialectics but, by patiently reconstructing them, enables us to see both the rationale for this turn and addresses in a compelling way three perennial questions concerning Adorno's 'method'. First, the place of his invocation of Nietzschean genealogy within negative dialectics (as tracking the dimension of affect). Second, the so-called 'elitism' of Adorno's recourse to the subjective experience of the social critic (where Adorno is clear, even if Honneth is less convinced, that only a few have the sensitivities required for accomplishing this role well -- Adorno's view here may be seen, though Honneth does not use this term, as a form of parametric universalism). Third, Adorno's use of 'model analysis' (as a recourse to working through exemplars of philosophical ideas in order to show that their failure to acknowledge both their own origin in situations of originary drive satisfaction and the significance of subjective experience leaves them unable to do justice to the state of affairs they address).

This concern with the trajectory of, and from, Adorno in Critical Theory re-emerges in the final essay since here Honneth acknowledges the cogency of Wellmer's challenge to communicative reason (of which, of course, Wellmer was one of the key architects). The core of this challenge lies, first, in Wellmer's recourse via Adorno (and to some degree Benjamin) to art and aesthetic experience as exploding the categorizations of communicative reason and, second, to political decision-making as marking a moment beyond the justificatory resources of communicative reason (one sees the influence of Derrida on Wellmer here). Yet the interesting move that Wellmer makes is to seek to accommodate these aesthetic and political limitations on the integrative, justificatory power of communicative reason by moving from a Kantian understanding of the democratic constitutional state to a more Hegelian conception of democratic ethical life in which art and politics both play a central role and yet are oriented towards the cultivation of democratic subjectivity (one might see links here to the kind of position developed in the recent work of Aletta Norval). In one respect, such a Hegelian move is clearly to Honneth's taste yet, in this final chapter, Honneth appears uncertain of the full implications of Wellmer's work for Honneth's own project of renewing Critical Theory. It is a mark of Honneth's fundamental intellectual honesty that he doesn't disguise this point, rather he presents it as opening a debate within contemporary Critical Theory in which a dialectical reading of its history of the kind presented in this volume has a central role to play.