Patriotic Elaborations: Essays in Practical Philosophy

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Charles Blattberg, Patriotic Elaborations: Essays in Practical Philosophy, McGill-Queens University Press, 2009, 383pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780773534919.

Reviewed by Allen Habib, University of Calgary


As the title implies, this is a collection of essays that elaborate the political philosophy Blattberg introduced in his earlier writings, in particular his book From Pluralist to Patriotic Politics, Putting Practice First (Oxford, 2000). In that book Blattberg advanced a novel theory of politics that he called patriotism, a theory subtended by a hermeneutical approach to conceptual and political analysis in the style of Charles Taylor. Roughly half of the material in this book has appeared in previous venues in various guises, either as individual articles or chapters in collections, while half is new to publication. Although most of the new material advances themes and arguments from his earlier work there is much new and interesting work in it.

Blattberg's patriotism posits a civil polity with a common good, one that patriots strive to achieve together via the political process. The theory rests on hermeneutical principles, such as a radical version of linguistic and conceptual holism that makes the meaning and nature of things like moral values and political goods entirely context-dependent. On this picture we understand values and goods in the context of our shared social practices. However, although this universe is whole, it is also 'cracked'; there are gaps or holes between the values underlying the practices. These cracks, when they result in conflict, stop the normal social flow and 'throw up' the conflicting values to us, values that are normally invisible due to their smooth functioning in the web of practices. Hermeneutic conflict resolution is an interpretive affair, in which one seeks to reconcile the apparently conflicting values by making alterations either in them, in some other parts of the web, or in both.

Blattberg applies this hermeneutical analysis to politics and political entities. The resultant schema is one that takes conflicts between people as the central issue in politics and classifies political theories in terms of their approaches to such conflicts. Patriotism conceives of social conflict as hermeneutic breakdowns in practice; as such, these are opportunities for interpretive reconciliation, to be achieved through what Blattberg calls 'conversation'. Patriotic conversation is a form of dialogue aimed at reconciliation, as opposed to accommodation or domination. Reconciliation is the re-integration of the conflicting values (or goods) into the web of practice; in other words, it is the re-interpretation either of the values themselves or of some other components of the practice, so as to make them compatible again. Accommodation, on the other hand, seeks merely to negotiate a compromise between (what are taken to be) irreconcilable values, understanding that doing so will sacrifice some value on the part of one if not both parties.

Blattberg claims that contemporary political theories either deny conflicts between values by proposing a single 'neutralist' system of arbitration (e.g. Rawls) or they merely seek accommodation between conflicting values, on the assumption that reconciliation is impossible (e.g. Berlin, Hampshire). However, reconciliation in which neither party 'loses' any of their values is surely a superior outcome to any negotiated settlement, argues Blattberg. Thus a dialogue aimed at this outcome is the best possible form of dialogue. Only the patriotic position espouses such a dialogue.

This collection expands on the theory in a number of ways. There are too many individual essays (13) and too many themes and topics to accommodate a comprehensive review. Instead, I'll limit myself to what I take to be the most interesting new theme Blattberg develops in the book, that of the nature of hermeneutical creation, as opposed to interpretation, and the implications for political and ethical theory.

Breaking with other hermeneuticists like Gadamer and Taylor, Blattberg draws a sharp distinction between the hermeneutical processes of interpretation and creation. Whereas interpretation is a matter of attempting to make sense of the world by integrating and reconciling conflicting practices, creation is a matter of exploiting the very cracks or gaps in the framework of reality that interpretation seeks to mend. Moreover, Blattberg takes creativity to be transcendental: its source is 'inspirational', or outside of the self. In his preferred metaphor, artists create by letting the inspirational light shine through the cracks of reality. As such, creation is an inherently violent process for Blattberg, exploiting as it does the holes in the fabric of the world. This sacred and violent aesthetic theory puts creativity outside of the realm of practical rationality, and thus beyond the reach of dialogue.

Blattberg employs this distinction between interpretation and creation and the associated theory of creation in a number of interesting ways. In "Secular Nationhood? The Importance of Language in the Life of Nations" Blattberg uses the distinction to ground a theory of nationalism and the nation-state, one that plays an important role in several developments of his larger political theory. On Blattberg's view, nations are distinct from other polities in that they are united (in part) by a common aesthetic vision, one created and maintained by national artists. An artist here is understood in the broad sense, as someone who creates the stories (and values) that form the core of a nation.

The aesthetic dimension is one that has been largely ignored by theorists of nationalism (Blattberg surveys in particular Gellner, Anderson, Taylor, Bhabha and Marx). But, Blattberg argues, this dimension has important ramifications, both for our conception of the nation-state and for our practice of intra-state political dialogue. The creative dimension of nationalism explains both the seeming deafness of nationalists and their apparent intransigence to negotiation. The deafness is essentially a matter of creative destruction, while the intransgience is an attempt to mend fragments together. Also, the creative aspect explains the special relationship between nations and language: a nation must always have a national language, as language functions as the medium of artistic expression of the nation. (Here Blattberg uses another metaphor: the national language is the 'mitt' in which the artistic inspirations are 'caught' [p. 72].)

Regarding the way in which his aesthetic political theory might affect our practice of intra-state political dialogue, Blattberg argues that appreciating the aesthetic/religious dimension of nations is the first step towards a proper dialogue between nations that share a state. In the next essay, "Federalism and Multinationalism", he applies this insight to the case of Canada. Blattberg argues that recognition of the Quebecois as a nation, i.e. as a polity united by a common artistic vision inscribed in "the language of [their] poets", will allow us to see the distinction between 'self-determination' and 'self-government' (p. 72). The 'self-determination' is a demand of nationalists, as it relates directly to the control they have over those institutions which bear on their (linguistic) nation. The 'self-government' is not so demanded by nationalists, at least not necessarily, depending on the power-sharing arrangements between the nation and its encompassing state.

In "What's Wrong with Hypergoods?" Blattberg uses the creative/interpretive distinction to ground a critique of Charles Taylor's theory of hypergoods, or fundamental ur-goods that form the basis of moral systems. Blattberg argues Taylor's account doesn't adequately discriminate between interpretation and creation. This causes Taylor to misconceive hypergoods as the results of interpretive efforts, and thus as ethical rather than aesthetic entities. Blattberg argues to the contrary that hypergoods are aesthetic objects (in much the same manner as nations) created by the destructive 'sundering' of the web of values and practices by artists. Blattberg claims that Taylor's hope for 'reconciliation' (as Taylor calls it) via dialogue and practical reason is empty.

In "On the Minimal Global Ethic" Blattberg appeals to the creative process to help ground a minimal global ethic, a core of ethical values common to all cultures to serve as a conversational bridge between them. Blattberg's theory is that the ethic is actually indigenous to all cultures and that it emerges through both interpretative and creative processes. Blattberg attributes the interpretive process to the working of physical humor like slapstick. Blattberg proposes a theory of humor that makes it out to be a matter of breaks in practice, which invite us to focus on the conflicting values and to attempt a reconciliation. Slapstick's breaks, centered as they are on the body and its foibles and frailties, invite us to consider the vulnerability of the body as well as its universality. This is the source of common ethical values that Blattberg calls 'body-friendly', i.e., those that forbid the infliction of damage or pain.

In order to explain the creative source of the minimal global ethic, Blattberg again depends on the idea that true creation, as opposed to interpretation, is a matter of taking advantage of the 'cracks' or breaks in the fabric of the world, allowing the transcendent to get through. He calls those texts and practices that allow for such inspiration 'epiphanic sites', and he cites the Torah and the Halakhah laws of the Talmud as examples of such sites. Then, borrowing a central concept from Lévinas, he claims that the 'faces' of others are such sites; by watching us they invite revelatory creation, which Blattberg characterizes as a "consistent communication emanating from them, demanding … that we give them a certain minimum of respect" (pp. 181-2).

In "Good, Bad, Great, Evil", Blattberg uses the distinction between creation and interpretation to define basic ethical terms. He takes good and bad to be matters of interpretation. While good interpretation is that which leads to reconciliation and integration or re-integration of values, bad interpretation leads in the opposite direction, to the disaggregation and disharmony of values. Greatness and evil, however, are matters of creation rather than interpretation; more specifically, greatness is a matter of creation, and evil a matter of destruction. Both are fundamentally irrational, however, since neither is a matter of the interpretive attempt to 'make sense' of the world. Rather, both concern the 'cracks' or 'gaps' between the parts of the world -- creative acts allow the light of inspiration in through these gaps, whereas destructive acts "forc[e] people's identities into the cracks of non-being" (p.199). The ostensive motive for evil is generally also one of creative force -- the evildoer asserts that the victim is preventing him from achieving creative greatness. One insight to take away from this rendering of the terms is that evil, as an irrational, destructive force, isn't amenable to dialogue of either the conversational or negotiational sort.

I turn now to criticism. My principal complaint is with the volume's ambitious scope and sometimes skimpy supporting argumentation. Blattberg often posits bold new philosophical claims without offering very much in the way of argumentative support. The theory of creativity is a paradigmatic example of this.

What the brief survey above shows is that the theory of creation and creativity that subtends the distinction between interpretation and creation does a tremendous amount of philosophical work in Blattberg's thought. We see it here acting as the crucial differentia of nations, as the ground of Taylor's hypergoods, as (one of) the sources of the minimal global ethic, and as a crucial element of a general ethical theory. However, for such a central theoretical component, there is not very much argument for it in its own right.

There are some arguments offered in support of the theory, but generally tepid ones. In "Secular Nationhood", where the theory first appears, Blattberg admits it is "idiosyncratic", but he asserts that "it supports an account of the role that artists have played … as regards their national communities that serves as an important complement to those that have been developed so far" (p.60). This abductive sort of appeal to the fit with other theories is not very rhetorically powerful. In "On the Minimum Global Ethic", Blattberg argues in a similar vein that the theory goes some distance in explaining modernist art, but again, this is not an adequate defense. This lack of support for framework elements such as the theory of creativity is mirrored in other aspects of the book (e.g., the novel theory of humor advanced in "On the Minimal Global Ethic"). Blattberg often rests elaborate rhetorical structures on novel conceptual grounds without very much in the way of a substantive defense of those grounds.

In its favor, however, the theories and insights that he advances in support of his claims are thoroughly original and often quite provocative. The analyses he provides of traditional elements in light of his new theories are fruitful and interesting. While the collection suffers from over-breadth and a lack of systematic focus, it rewards the careful reader with a rich and ingenious tapestry of related strands, and a distinctively fresh and different perspective on traditional political and ethical topics and puzzles.

As a work of scholarship, the book reveals an author who uses a tremendous range of materials and commands of a variety of analytic techniques. Blattberg effortlessly moves through vastly different canons of scholarship -- from classical hermeneutics to contemporary theories of justice and politics to Talmudic interpretation and Kabbalic mysticism and many others besides -- with enviable ease, and this prowess results in some fascinating synergistic insights.