Peace Talks -- Who Will Listen?

Placeholder book cover

Fred Dallmayr, Peace Talks -- Who Will Listen?, University of Notre Dame Press, 2004, 288pp, $20.00 (pbk), ISBN 026802569X.

Reviewed by Jerald Wallulis, University of South Carolina


Fred Dallmayr has made another important contribution to comparative philosophical and religious studies from his well-known -- and well-established -- continental philosophical perspective. In this case the topic could hardly be more relevant, even if it may also appear to be quite challenged by the immediate political situation. Peace on a global scale between religions and nations now enmeshed in what is called by many media pundits a "religious war" or a "clash of civilizations," indeed peacemaking through nonviolence, above all through dialogue between the religions in conflict -- as the subtitle indicates, "who will listen"?

The title of the book, Peace Talks, recalls the beginning of The Complaint of Peace (Querela pacis) written in 1517 by Erasmus of Rotterdam. The reference is both intentional and important, since Dallmayr finds both historical parallels between the historical period of Erasmus and our own time and great inspiration from the thinking and the piety (eruditio et pietas) of this Christian humanist thinker. Although our own time is dominated by processes of globalization that may appear to mark a decline of the European nation-state quite different from the time of its inception, "Erasmus's age was similar to ours in its turbulence and its bent to relentless violence." (x) In the midst of conflicts between nation-states, between religious denominations, and between newly emerging social classes, Erasmus sought to avoid taking sides, promote dialogue between different religious confessions, and advocate peace.

Erasmus personifies Peace in the dialogue and gives her the role of plaintiff in a law case. Her complaint is that of shabby treatment by humankind who chooses instead to lavish praise and honors on the making of war, even when it is not the last resort or it is entered into for non-defensive purposes. Dallmayr's analysis of the reasons behind this unfortunate choice relies on other writings from Erasmus and alludes at the same time to other well known sources of his own thinking:

Emulating Aristotle's teachings (and anticipating those of Hegel), experience for Erasmus signifies not just a factual happening, but rather a seasoning or learning process which transforms the person undergoing the experience. Given their endowment with speech and reason, human beings also are capable of reflective remembrance, especially of the recollection of past sufferings -- leading to the determination to avoid their recurrence in the future. Unfortunately, Erasmus laments, this capability is not always exercised or developed -- with the result that many people grow older without apparently learning anything, especially from the horrors of past and present wars. Given this obtuseness or amnesia, he writes, war, has in fact become "such an accepted thing that people are astonished to find anyone who does not like it." (33-4)

Dallmayr supports Peace not only in her complaint but also in her desirability. In particular, he puts forward a number of "friends of the court" since the time of Erasmus who can speak and act on her behalf. He points to well known religious figures such as John Paul II and the Dalai Lama, but also to the lesser known Vietnamese monk, Thich Nhat Hanh. More generally, in Chapter Four he distinguishes between two different kinds of spiritual traditions in both Christianity and Islam. The one kind, "gnostic spirituality," construes the spiritual relationship in strongly hierarchical or vertical terms so that the divine differs from the worldly as higher does to lower, light to darkness, spirit over and against matter. The other kind, "erotic mystical" or agape spirituality, operates "in the mode not of negation or strict subordination, but of sublimation and transformative analogy." (70) Rather than a culmination in deification, it stresses the mediated and "covenantal" relation between the infinite and finite. While each kind of spirituality has its strengths and weaknesses, Dallmayr is in no way impartial. Both Christian agape and Islamic mahabbah issue in a love for both the divine and fellow human beings. Consequently, there is within the erotic mystical traditions of both Christianity and Islam the basis for an ortho-"praxis" of greater import than religious ortho-"doxy". In a similar manner, orthopraxis leads Erasmus "to privilege pious conduct … over dogmas and rituals, ecumenical peacemaking over doctrinal apologetics." As will be seen later, it is also the guiding wellspring for the religious and ethical stance of Mahatma Gandhi.

Not all the "friends of the court" of Peace are so avowedly religious; Dallmayr also points to Hannah Arendt and Walter Benjamin. Arendt plays a particularly crucial role in Peace Talks because of her famous critique of violence,which is examined in Chapter Six. Against the predominant tendency in political analysis and social-scientific thinking to identify power and violence, she recalls the emphasis of the civic republican tradition upon the "living power of the people." Dallmayr finds that "a crucial distinction between power and violence comes to the fore: whereas power always 'stands in need of numbers,' violence up to a point 'can manage without them because it relies on implements' (that is, the tools and strategies of coercion)." (118) Because of the power of coercion, Arendt states, "Violence can always destroy power." (119) But because of the limitations of the tools and strategies of violence, "what can never grow out of it is power." (119) Arendt's conclusion is strongly endorsed by Dallmayr: "The practice of violence, like all action, changes the world; but the most probable change is to a more violent world." (119)

A further Erasmian spirit is the contemporary Italian political philosopher Noberto Bobbio discussed in Chapter Nine. Rather than folly, Bobbio praises meekness in "one of the finest tributes paid to religious and classical virtues in recent political-philosophical literature." (184) Bobbio distinguishes the social virtue of meekness from the personal attribute of mildness and insists that it not be confused with submissiveness or passive compliance:

While a submissive person is someone who "abandons the struggle due to weakness, fear, or resignation," meek persons "do not yield" or submit because they basically repudiate and transgress the rules of the game governing domination. Being non-submissive, meek persons are also calm, serene, and even cheerful -- the latter because "they are inwardly convinced the world to which they aspire is better than the one they are forced to inhabit." (186)

Instead of the game of domination, the meek possess power of a very different kind that comes from "letting the other be himself."

Bobbio's praise for meekness is, if anything, exceeded by its endorsement by Dallmayr. Bobbio claims that meekness is not a political virtue, in recognition of but also in concession to "the violent society in which we are forced to live." By contrast, Dallmayr interjects the ethical and political orthopraxis of Mahatma Gandhi and argues:

Neither his engagement for the poor nor his cultivation of "weak" virtues, however, kept Gandhi away from politics or from involvement in political struggle. Like the "meek" described by Bobbio, he was non-submissive and unyielding, as well as calm and frequently cheerful; but he was particularly unyielding when dealing with abusive and oppressive political power. In his struggle for India's independence, Gandhi did not shrink from inserting himself in the thick of politics -- but a politics of a different kind, carried on in a different register, at odds with and in defiance of sheer power politics. (188-89)

Gandhi's nonviolence (ahimsa) and ethical action (karmayoga and satyagraha) "combined open-minded fairness with religious faith, liberal tolerance and commitment to freedom with ethical orthopraxis." (191)

Not only does Gandhi's "meekness" challenge Bobbio's distinction between what are political and nonpolitical virtues, but also his path of nonviolence also inspires Dallmayr to a less "somber" assessment of its potentials than what Arendt offers in her essay. In regard to other possible colonial regimes, she worries that the same politics might eventuate in massacre and submission rather than decolonization. Dallmayr replies, "It is good to recall that many or the most progressive and humanly empowering changes in the twentieth century have occurred mostly through nonviolent means." (130) By offering the examples of the decolonization of India, the civil rights struggle in America, the abolition of apartheid in South Africa, and the "velvet revolutions" in Eastern Europe, he offers his own answer to the initial question posed as to who will and should listen to peace: "would it not behoove responsible intellectuals everywhere to join the great humanitarian benefactors of the last century and to champion, whenever and wherever feasible, the course of nonviolence and satyagraha?" (131)

Dallmayr's question should be answered as he intends, but it may still be questioned whether Arendt's scepticism is thereby eliminated or even necessarily reduced. Moreover, the primary concern may not even be this one, but Dallmayr's concentrated focus upon Gandhi to respond to the concerns of both Bobbio and Arendt. Does this focus, while of course entirely appropriate by way of example, also entail that there is only one way that peace "talks" and acts? Moving to the other side of Dallmayr's truly important and illuminating concept, is there an "ortho" in the sense of not only "correct" but "the only correct" way of "ortho"-praxis in analogy to what is certainly a standard understanding of "ortho"-doxy?

For example, South Africa is cited as a powerful source of evidence in support of nonviolence. However, does the presence of a militant wing of the African National Congress and its increased activities after 1979 then represent a betrayal of the orthopraxis of peace or rather a different expression of the actual advancement of peace? Much more controversially, can figures such as Franz Fanon be viewed not simply as erroneous advocates of violence, but quite differently as positive associates with the poor in the struggle for peace? One of the most powerful expressions of peaceful orthopraxis in Peace Talks is the love of God of Teresa of Avila, which, in Dalmayr's words, "translates concretely into loving care for the needy and the sufferings of humankind." While it may not be "orthopractical" in the full religious dimension, does not Fanon fully care for the sufferings of the "wretched of the earth" under colonialism and fully identify with the Algerians in their struggle to respond to its original terror?

These questions are not raised in order to undermine the concept of orthopraxis, but only to prevent a too easy analogizing to a typically rigid understanding of orthodoxy. The concept itself is the most valuable of many important contributions which Dallmayr achieves in Peace Talks. Beyond the topics reviewed here there are additional valuable discussions of the law of the peoples, cosmopolitanism, Confucianism, Gandhi on Islam, and Heidegger on exile or homelessness. And of at least equal interest is the Appendix in which Dallmayr exhibits his own praxis of peaceful philosophical dialogue by analyzing the larger meaning of the events of September 11 in a way that can be very fruitfully related to almost all of the themes discussed above. As that Appendix concludes,

The task, as anyone can see, is enormous; but the alternative is the morass of terrorism and the "wars" it triggers. The issue is not one of optimism or pessimism, but of active engagement. I, for one, am unwilling to abandon the promise contained in Immanuel Kant's vision of "perpetual peace" -- even if we are only able to advance inch by inch toward this goal. (216)