Peirce and the Conduct of Life: Sentiment and Instinct in Ethics and Religion

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Richard Kenneth Atkins, Peirce and the Conduct of Life: Sentiment and Instinct in Ethics and Religion, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 231pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107161306.

Reviewed by  Diana B. Heney, Fordham University


Richard Kenneth Atkins presents an articulation and defense of the practical philosophy of Charles Sanders Peirce. He begins by acknowledging the rather large elephant in the room: Peirce is “not well known for his practical philosophy” (1). The overarching purpose of this volume is to correct the view that what Peirce has to offer by way of advice for the conduct of life is minimal at best. The project is an ambitious one, for this view has been widespread even among Peirce scholars and historians of American pragmatism. Indeed, perhaps the most common view has been that what Peirce does offer concerning conduct is not merely minimal, but also positively unsavoury. By presenting and developing Peirce’s ideas about the conduct of life, Atkins aims to make the case that Peirce’s practical philosophy is (i) an essential part of his architectonic, (ii) critical to understanding his mature thought, and (iii) a distinctive pragmatist position with contemporary relevance. On all three points, I agree. By presenting and developing Peirce’s ideas about God and religion, Atkins also aims to make the related case that (iv) Peirce’s philosophy of religion deserves greater prominence in historical interpretations of the pragmatist tradition. On this point, I count myself persuaded, though in this case as a matter of historical accuracy rather than out of any agreement with the content of Peirce’s views on this topic.

The book’s six chapters vary noticeably from one another in structure, length, and textual focus. While some chapters are close considerations of a key text, others range widely to build toward interpretations that could not be supported by any single text. It may be helpful for the reader to regard the volume not as an extended argumentative arc beginning in Chapter 1 and culminating in Chapter 6, but rather as a sequential presentation of attached ideas on topics of vital importance. This argumentative structure brings to mind Hilary Putnam’s many-legged table: “We all know that a table with many legs wobbles when the floor on which it stands is not even, but such a table is very hard to turn over” (Putnam, 2004, 28). In the case of Atkins’s monograph, one could disagree with the main thrust of some chapters, or the interpretation of some core notions, without tipping the table. It is also worth noting that the uneven floor here is Peirce’s actual manuscripts, which span several decades and reveal significant changes in his philosophical system over time.

If I may stretch Putnam’s metaphor a little farther, let me now say which legs of this particular table seemed to me to be essential, and which add to the structure without necessarily providing any additional stability. On my reading, the most crucial support for theses (i)-(iii) which I have ascribed to Atkins can be found in Chapters 1, 2, 4, and 5, which I shall consider closely after setting Chapters 3 and 6 to the side.

Chapter 3, “Heeding the Call of One’s Savior”, is an exercise in being maximally charitable to Peirce. This is perhaps also why it is, by a considerable margin, the longest chapter in the book — for the views Atkins seeks to articulate charitably here need considerable help. Peirce had an idiosyncratic stance on religion, including his occasional insistence on regarding evolution as growth in a positive sense, directed by God’s love. As Peirce’s fellow pragmatist George Santayana pointed out, growth itself need not be a positive thing:

the fact that [a] dogmatic structure, for the time being, stands and grows passes for a proof of its rightness. Right indeed it is in one sense, as vegetation is right; it is vital; it has plasticity and warmth, and a certain indirect correspondence with its soil and climate . . . [but] In the jungle one tree strangles another, and luxuriance itself is murderous (Santayana, 1923, 7-8).

Atkins himself notes that Peirce’s “agapasticism [evolution by love]” is rather mystical, and does not seek to defend it (139). Instead, this chapter is devoted to defending the rather notorious “Neglected Argument for the Reality of God”. I am inclined to say of this text what Atkins says of Peirce’s earlier effort in philosophy of religion, the 1892 “Evolutionary Love”: “I have no interest here in defending that essay” (59). Although Atkins succeeds in making Peirce’s neglected argument look more plausible than it might appear when read in isolation, I am not persuaded that the argument deserves the amount of textual spadework and interpretive legwork required to make it plausible. Atkins argues that it is not actually an argument for God’s reality (despite the title), but instead an argument for the rational permissibility of a belief in a God. He also acknowledges that if this is accurate, Peirce published an account of his own position so confusing that most Peirce scholars have not understood it. This chapter will be of interest to the reader whose primary aim is to secure a well-rounded understanding of the classical pragmatists’ contributions to philosophy of religion, for Atkins does succeed in showing that Peirce was on numerous occasions animated by questions proper to that sphere. From a historical perspective this chapter demonstrates (iv). The reader who seeks a grasp of Peirce’s practical philosophy at its most general will find ample support for (i)-(iii) elsewhere.

Chapter 6, “Peirce and Practical Ethics”, is an exercise in extending Peirce’s practical thought into the 21st century. Atkins begins to show routes forward for the contemporary Peircean who is interested in ethics, or the contemporary ethicist who could be persuaded by the rest of the volume to become interested in Peirce. But since the Peircean may need to be persuaded that Peirce has something of value to say about conduct, and the ethicist will almost certainly need to be persuaded to take Peirce seriously, the fate of Chapter 6 rests on the success of the earlier chapters. I should note that this chapter will be highly relevant for those who are interested in the fecund intersection of contemporary pragmatism and bioethics (such as developed in McGee 1999), as Atkins’s suggestion here is that Peirce’s account offers resources to reconcile the methods of casuistry and principalism.

Let me now turn to the chapters whose support is essential in demonstrating (i)-(iii).

Chapter 1, “Peirce’s ‘Paradoxical Irradiations’ and James’s The Will to Believe”, takes up a highly controversial text: Peirce’s 1898 lecture, “Philosophy and the Conduct of Life”. Atkins argues that this lecture is valuable for revealing deep differences between the philosophical views of Peirce and his frequent benefactor, William James. Atkins presents the lecture as an “oblique” criticism of James’s philosophy. I agree with the general thrust here, though I have interpreted what is going on in Peirce’s 1898 lectures, along with his 1903 lectures, as rather direct in opposing aspects of James’s pragmatism (Heney 2016). Having had but few opportunities to publicly pronounce his philosophy, Peirce would not have tossed those opportunities away out of ire or spite — and so Peirce scholars are on the hook for explaining the content of these lectures.

Atkins rises admirably to the challenge, showing that a crucial difference between Peirce and James concerns their views on the ways in which a hypothesis should be tested. While Peirce maintains that “we must look to the upshot of our concepts in order rightly to apprehend them” (Peirce, Collected Papers, 5.3), he interprets this quite broadly: the key upshot to assess is not our own prudential benefit, but instead the success our concept has in terms of its explanatory generality. By contrast, James suggests that theories compete for champions, such that the key upshot is how many people cleave to a view (17). This difference concerning testing is of critical importance to understanding why Peirce and James wrangled for decades about which concept of truth should be taken up. There is also a deep difference revealed concerning the relationship between philosophical theories and everyday life. Peirce maintains that while theories must be put to the test in arduous ways, our everyday choices about conduct are not products of deliberative reason, but rather run on the rails of sentiment and instinct. Given that James defended rationality itself as a sentiment, or sentimental preference, we can see just how deep the gap between these two thinkers is at a critical juncture for the practice of pragmatism — for Peirce is firm in his separation of theory from practice.

In addition to its careful treatment of an important and disputed lecture, Atkins’s analysis in Chapter 1 also makes contact with contemporary pragmatist debates concerning the (non)existence of doxastically efficacious beliefs and the vexed question of the relationship between pragmatism and pluralism (26; 10).

Chapter 2 unpacks Peirce’s sentimental conservatism at length, attempting to show that critics ranging from Victoria Lady Welby to Cornelius de Waal can be satisfactorily addressed once we understand Peirce’s account of instinct and sentiment. While Chapter 1 will be especially useful to readers new to Peirce, Chapter 2 will be of great value to new readers and seasoned Peirce scholars alike. Without trying to make Peirce likable as a character — his sentimental conservatism can look “like an ugly thing indeed” — Atkins locates the possible justification for the view in Peirce’s very detailed account of hereditary human instincts and instinct-based sentiments (35; 37). The view itself has two components: the first is that we ought not to trust too much to reason or to the possibility that theory will effectively steer conduct, and the second is that what we ought to trust instead are our sentiments and instincts. An important insight is that Peirce believes that instincts are basic, though not necessarily “base”: selective pressures over the long run of the species have set humans up to have a diverse complement of instincts, including instincts related to reason itself (62). While a discussion of the full range of instincts and their relative importance in guiding conduct outstrips this space, it is worth noting that the operation of common sense on Peirce’s view — which is tied up with instinct — is not beyond rational criticism, nor to be treated as infallible. Peirce’s fallibilism applies across the board, but while it is front and center in the reasoning processes of theoretical contexts, it arises in practical contexts only when action is arrested.

Chapter 4, “On Becoming Welded into the Universal Continuum”, offers an interpretation of Peirce’s view of the highest good of human life, the growth of concrete reasonableness. Atkins considers where in Peirce’s classification of the sciences the end of conduct could be determined, and points to the mature classification to show that it must be esthetics. Atkins then interprets Peirce’s esthetics through the lens of Kant, aiming to shed light on remarks made by Peirce about the practical equivalent of the theoretical call to seek the greatest generality in one’s judgments: becoming welded into a universal continuum. While the reader could be forgiven for thinking that turning to Kant to interpret Peirce is akin to throwing gasoline on the fire, Peirce himself declared that “when I was a babe in philosophy, my bottle was filled from the udders of Kant” (Peirce, Collected Papers, 2.113). Atkins persuasively argues that Peirce’s interest in judgments of maximally general application has a Kantian character.

Chapter 5, “Self-Control and Moral Responsibility”, concerns freedom and the possibility of moral responsibility. Atkins presents both as consistent with Peirce’s account of God, but inconsistent with a mechanistic view of the universe and the hypothesis that mechanism seems to suggest for human behaviour (psychological hedonism). To the extent that the argumentative thread of this chapter requires the hypothesis that God is outside time, the reader’s interest may turn on interest in that claim — but Atkins also carefully unpacks Peirce’s account of self-controlled action, which offers a paradigm explanation rather than a set of necessary and sufficient conditions. In our own experience, Peirce believes that we have no trouble in picking out the self-controlled actions from those brought about in other ways. The elements typically present in such actions are: an ideal; an intention; a formulation of rules of action; foreseeing an opportunity to act; a resolution to act; the process of imprinting the resolution on one’s nature (habituation); the determination to act as rooted in one’s habituations; and the capacity to compare the resulting action to the ideal (182-5). This descriptive analysis is worth close engagement, and can sit comfortably alongside contemporary views of moral responsibility, blame, and forgiveness that offer paradigm accounts.

Two general features of the volume also deserve attention. The first is that Atkins appears committed throughout to presenting the most consistent Peircean position — that is, the one that makes sense of the largest possible portion of Peirce’s writings. It is a live question, of course, whether the most consistent Peircean position is the most philosophically promising position. I will mention just one point where pressure might be exerted, which is on Peirce’s distinction (or distinctions) between theory and practice. In articulating Peirce’s practical philosophy, Atkins seems to cleave to such a distinction throughout, which allows him to say of ostensibly conflicting recommendations that Peirce offered, this for the laboratory; this for the workaday world. Yet one might think that the most promising Peircean position would require giving up on any sharp divide between theory and practice, and that actual human endeavours rarely present clear-cut cases that of the purely practical or purely theoretical.

A second and related point is that Atkins displays impeccable historical scholarship. There are tantalizing isolated remarks at many places in Peirce’s manuscripts. Clarence Irving Lewis, who shared an office with the Peirce papers at Harvard, said that working through them was akin to “’receiving a thousand suggestions, on a hundred topics” (Lewis, 1968 [1960], 16). But there are also many expressions of systematic ambition. The very first paragraph of the Collected Papers (albeit, chosen by its editors) expresses that ambition, as Peirce grandly declares that “To erect a philosophical edifice that shall outlast the vicissitudes of time, my care must be, not so much to set each brick with nicest accuracy, as to lay the foundations deep and massive” (Peirce, Collected Papers, 1.1). Atkins reads Peirce as one would imagine he would like to be read: with respect for the attempted systematicity of a massive body of work, and with the patience and charity needed to reconcile a great many moving parts. Atkins also shows easy familiarity with, and makes extensive use of, the relevant secondary literature. This volume is a genuine contribution to contemporary Peirce scholarship.


Heney, Diana B. (2016). Toward a Pragmatist Metaethics. Routledge.

Lewis, Clarence Irving (1968 [1960]). “Autobiography.” In The Philosophy of C.I. Lewis, ed Paul Schlipp. Open Court, 1-21.

McGee, Glenn (ed.) (1999). Pragmatic Bioethics. Cambridge, MIT Press.

Peirce, Charles Sanders (1931-58). Collected Papers of Charles Sanders Peirce, i-vi ed. C. Hartshorne and P. Weiss, eds.; vii and viii, ed. A. Burks. Belknap Press. Cited as Collected Papers plus volume and paragraph number.

Putnam, Hilary (2004). Ethics Without Ontology. Harvard University Press.

Santayana, George (1923). Scepticism and Animal Faith. Dover.