Peirce and the Threat of Nominalism

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Paul Forster, Peirce and the Threat of Nominalism, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 259pp., $82.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521118996.

Reviewed by Nathan Houser, Indiana University


Charles Peirce is an enigmatic figure in philosophy. He is widely regarded to have been important historically and to have continuing relevance, but what his influence was and how he is still relevant remains unsettled. Key ideas and insights from Peirce are frequently featured in contemporary research ranging across much of philosophy, and across other disciplines, yet when these ideas are considered together, it is difficult to see how they can belong to one system of thought. A notable accomplishment of Paul Forster, in the book under review, is that he has achieved a comprehensive account of most of Peirce's leading ideas in a way that gives the reader a grasp of how everything fits together in the context of Peirce's battle against nominalism. This is no mere device for unifying Peirce's wide-ranging ideas; his opposition to nominalism motivated him as nothing else did and, as Forster shows, is central to his philosophical program. While Peirce's argument against nominalism was strictly philosophical, his objection to it extended beyond logic to what he regarded as the undesirable consequences of nominalism for civilization. This gave Peirce a sense of urgency in his effort to provide a realist alternative for philosophy and science.

Peirce understood nominalism in the broad anti-realist sense usually attributed to William of Ockham, as the view that reality consists exclusively of concrete particulars and that universality and generality have to do only with names and their significations. This view relegates properties, abstract entities, kinds, relations, laws of nature, and so on, to a conceptual existence at most. Peirce believed nominalism (including what he referred to as "the daughters of nominalism": sensationalism, phenomenalism, individualism, and materialism) to be seriously flawed and a great threat to the advancement of science and civilization. His alternative was a nuanced realism that distinguished reality from existence and that could admit general and abstract entities as reals without attributing to them direct (efficient) causal powers. Peirce held that these non-existent reals could influence the course of events by means of final causation (conceived somewhat after Aristotle's conception),[1]and that to banish them from ontology, as nominalists require, is virtually to eliminate the ground for scientific prediction as well as to underwrite a skeptical ethos unsupportive of moral agency.

Forster begins his systematic account of Peirce's argument against nominalism with a review of his treatment of logic as the science of inquiry. Peirce held that notwithstanding claims to the contrary, nominalism, as well as realism, rests on metaphysical assumptions; and he held that "logic provides the only secure basis for metaphysics" (p. 13). Logic, on Peirce's account, concerns the principles of right reasoning broadly speaking and therefore deals not only with deduction but with abductive and inductive forms of reasoning. "Logicians, on Peirce's view, seek to uncover the nature of concepts, the principles by which concepts combine in propositions and the principles by which propositions combine to yield warranted inferences" (p. 13). Although Peirce was a staunch proponent of the view that human life and thought is continuous with the rest of nature, he rejected the idea that the science of inquiry is a natural science. Logic is "an a priori science of formal, universal, necessary norms that license metaphysical conclusions" (p. 23). Peirce believed that logical/mathematical proofs are independent of any results of the natural sciences and rely on what he called "diagrammatic reasoning," operations on symbolic relational constructions of a kind with the geometric diagrams Euclid used in proving his theorems of geometry. Diagrams put one in direct contact with the relations under investigation and facilitate observation and experimentation of a kind with inquiry in the natural sciences.

Forster next examines Peirce's non-standard treatment of continuity and his claim that every general concept defines a continuum (p. 43). On Peirce's view, a continuum is not a collection of individual points, however dense, for between any two points on a continuous line there is room for any multitude of points ("the elements of continua, though distinguishable, are not discrete" (p. 57)). There are no individual points on a truly continuous line until a selection is made, in effect marking a place on the line and thereby creating a discontinuity; "the nominalist's attempt to define continuity as a kind of collection is doomed to fail."[2] According to Forster, Peirce's criticism of the nominalist account of continuity applies also to the nominalist account of general concepts. Generality is a form of continuity: "just as a true continuum is defined by a description that delimits a space of possible elements, so a general concept is defined by a characteristic that delimits a space of possible objects" (p. 60) and not by a collection of individuals. So far, Peirce's argument is formal and demonstrates only that laws and general concepts define continua without yet making any ontological claims.

The next step in Forster's account of Peirce's general argument against nominalism is a demonstration of the inadequacy of theories of cognitive content which attempt to account for the meaning of general concepts with reference only to individuals or sets of individuals. Peirce insists that "the notion of continuity is essential to understanding the testable content of any cognitive claim" (p. 66). His alternative theory, his pragmatic theory of meaning, associates the meaning of a concept with "the conceivable experimental consequences of its application to an object" and posits that the "conditionals that specify these consequences imply lawful relations between the acts involved in carrying out experiments and the results they produce" (pp. 72-73). Forster reminds us that continuity, on Peirce's account, cannot be reduced to a collection of individuals so "the content of these laws exceeds any collection of claims about individuals" (p. 73). This challenges the nominalist account of cognitive content.

The initial argument Peirce gave for his pragmatism, published in 1877-78,[3] was based on his conception of belief, derived from Alexander Bain's idea that beliefs are habits of action (p. 78), along with certain psychological principles. Peirce later discounted his original argument as psychologistic and devised new arguments based exclusively on formal (non-material) considerations. Drawing from Peirce's writings of the period of his original argument, Forster was able to reconstruct a strictly formal (a priori) argument for pragmatism that does not limit conceivability to material conditions: "the idea is to argue that given a proper analysis of inquiry certain general conditions must obtain in the world if inquiry is to be possible" (p. 80, n. 5). Forster's reconstruction is based on Peirce's identification of conceptions with signs and the claim that every sign represents an object as having certain characteristics and conveys this information through interpretation (an indirect effect of the sign's object on the interpreter).

Forster works through his proof in great detail showing what is essential for general conceptions to have cognitive meaning; among other requirements, meaningful cognitions must not only predicate characteristics of their objects but must also have an index to fix denotation. According to Forster, the "core of Peirce's theory of cognitive content" is expressed in the so-called "pragmatic maxim" which is a conditional of the form, "If act A were performed under conditions C, result R would occur," and this is the guiding maxim of "a theory of the meaning of those signs that are essential to the pursuit of truth by means of inquiry" (p. 66). Forster concludes his discussion of the proof by claiming that Peirce's pragmatic maxim implies that symbols (signs that make truth claims) "are meaningful only in a world governed by general laws or habits . . . a world in which objects behave in predictable ways when actions of a certain kind are performed on them under appropriate conditions" (p. 105). In the world as conceived by the nominalist, "the conditions for the application of concepts would never be fulfilled" (p. 77).

Having articulated Peirce's method for applying concepts (symbols) meaningfully to an actual world, Forster takes up the question of the role of experience in inquiry. Though contact with the external world may be direct, it is only through sensory and perceptual processes that experience can inform inquiry. The sensory given in experience, the percept, has no cognitive content but simply compels attention and triggers developed habits for using general terms. It is the general terms (propositional signs) triggered by percepts that constitute perceptual judgments and profess to represent objects and states of affairs. "Peirce takes perceptual judgments to be the first premises of knowledge -- the ultimate source of evidence in inquiry" (p. 128). He regards perceptual judgments as limit cases of abductive hypotheses which are justified not by how they are caused but on how well they accord with future experience. "For Peirce, then, the problem of verifying perceptual judgments is a special case of the problem of verifying hypotheses generally, a problem his theory of induction is intended to solve" (p. 146). Forster reviews Peirce's defense of induction as a self-corrective method and how abduction, induction, and deduction work together in inquiry.

Up to this point (through Ch. 7), Forster has reconstructed Peirce's logical argument for the intelligibility and verifiability of his hypothesis that laws and general kinds are real, and has demonstrated that Peirce's pragmatism "shows that the reality of laws is implied by the truth of any symbol" (p. 155). Forster is now almost ready to take up the central question of the reality of laws: does Peirce have a convincing justification for his claim that laws are real? Why does he think this is true? But first Forster gives a critique of the principal nominalist conceptions of truth and an account of Peirce's alternative which "challenges the foundations of the nominalist conception of knowledge" (p. 157). According to Peirce, each of the traditional nominalist theories, correspondence, coherence, consensus, and instrumental reliability, "rightly identify essential elements of truth" (p. 174) which are all "essential conditions of the truth of a symbol" (161). Forster claims that these competing nominalist accounts are reconciled in Peirce's pragmatic theory of truth which holds that "truth is a property that attaches to symbols that represent real objects" (p. 174).

Forster is now ready to address the crucial question: are laws real and how can they be accounted for? Peirce's alternative to nominalism was predicated on a positive answer to this question. Several factors come into play. Though Peirce was convinced that laws were part of the furniture of the universe, he was bound by his theory of inquiry to find a way to explain how they came to be. Nothing was to be admitted as inexplicable. But, as Forster points out, Peirce was confronted with this dilemma:

if the lawfulness of the universe is explicable, it seems there must be laws in terms of which the explanation is couched. But in that case lawfulness is explained in terms that presuppose it, and the explanation fails to account for lawfulness in general. On the other hand, if we posit a state prior to the emergence of lawfulness in which there are no laws operative, then we are left with no principles to appeal to in accounting for the emergence of laws. Whichever horn of the dilemma Peirce embraces, it seems he must violate the principles of rational inquiry (pp. 181-82).

Peirce's solution was to posit an original lawless chaos without any order but with an incipient tendency for habit-taking, "a potential for orderliness as yet unrealized but tending towards realization" (p. 184). The emergence of order in the cosmos could only have started by accident, as a spontaneous chance occurrence, but once started it would have strengthened "with the result that laws come increasingly to determine the course of events" (p. 183). According to Peirce, then, laws of nature are products of an ongoing evolution and their emergence results from an original tendency to form habits. Peirce's account of the evolution of laws explains what he calls the growth of reasonableness in the order of things.

Peirce's cosmology is much debated and is frequently disparaged. Although Forster acknowledges that Peirce's cosmology is "among the most difficult and controversial elements of his philosophy" (p. 176), even calling it "hideously obscure" (p. 184), he contends that it as an integral part of Peirce's philosophical system and an important part of his case against nominalism. It should be noted that Peirce was a scientist by profession and was well learned in late nineteenth-century physics. Although his cosmology may be properly said to be a metaphysical cosmology, it is not unreasonable to regard Peirce's effort as an early attempt to formulate a modern physical cosmology.[4] According to Forster, Peirce's

cosmological views result from the application of his mathematical analysis of continuity, his theory of symbols and his account of the method of inquiry to the question of the nature of being. On this reading, his account of reality is an attempt to draw out the implications of the hypothesis he calls 'synechism' -- the view that the continuity implied by laws affirmed in true symbols is real. . . . Synechism is an especially important hypothesis to consider, he thinks, because if it is correct, then, far from being ontologically superfluous, as the nominalist supposes, laws (i.e., true continua) form part of the order of things and, indeed, are essential to its intelligibility (p. 177).

Of special significance for Peirce was the need to posit chance as operative in the universe: "laws result from the working out of a tendency to generalize events that happen by chance" (p. 205). This view of chance as operative in nature was the central tenet of Peirce's doctrine of tychism and the basis for his objection to determinism. Peirce believed that "the prevalence of appeals to statistical laws in the kinetic theory of gases, evolution and social science" provided grounds for questioning whether the laws of nature are as exact as nominalists claim (p. 207). The issue for Peirce is not whether absolute chance causes events, a position he does not hold, but "whether the laws operative in the universe are deterministic -- in which case the order of events could not be other than it is -- or whether instead they are merely statistical" (pp. 212-13). Forster points out that Peirce's tychism provides a better basis for explaining growth, variety, lawfulness, and consciousness than the necessitarian hypothesis adopted by nominalism.

Forster concludes with some ethical considerations. Peirce's realism tends to favor community good over individual good, favored by nominalism. Peirce challenges the distinction that nominalists draw between facts and values and between theory and practice. He argues that the principles of inquiry are norms of conduct and "takes himself to have demonstrated the coherence of the idea of a science of norms and undermined the nominalist's view that normative questions are beyond the scope of rational inquiry" (p. 237). Finally, Peirce argues that truth is an intrinsic good and that to "attain truth is to attain reasonableness in the way of belief," and that reasonableness "is the only end that is unconditional and universal" (p. 237).

The preceding is a mere sketch of Forster's detailed account of the system of philosophy Peirce developed as an alternative to the received nominalism of his day (to some extent still dominant). This is the best and most comprehensive account to date of Peirce's challenge to nominalism, and it is a handy introduction to Peirce's philosophy in general. Forster correctly emphasizes Peirce's synechism, the view that continuity is the overall key conception, and he convincingly makes pragmatism a central component of Peirce's philosophy rather than a stand-alone theory of meaning as it has sometimes been regarded.

But there are shortcomings that must be mentioned; most notably Forster's mixing of references to Peirce's early and later writings and, to some extent, a neglect of Peirce's more developed ideas. For example, Forster makes frequent reference to symbols as the class of intellectual signs that pragmatism addresses, but it will be known to readers acquainted with Peirce's late semiotic writings that there are several kinds of symbolic signs, including arguments, and it might be wondered whether Forster means to refer to all of them. Also, there are some signs that are not symbols (e.g., different classes of legisigns) which are general signs and might be supposed to be subject to pragmatic analysis. One wonders whether Forster had Peirce's early work in mind where he used just three classes of signs: icons, indexes, and symbols. Another example is what Forster says about Peirce's proof of pragmatism. He concentrates on Peirce's earliest proof, which Peirce found to be inadequate, and neglects his later sustained attempts to formulate more satisfactory proofs. Forster ingeniously reconstructs an alternative to Peirce's early proof based on his early semiotic conceptions, but he doesn't mention that in 1907 Peirce constructed his own proof of pragmatism also based on an analysis of semiotic conceptions.[5] These shortcomings, as well as Forster's decision, however practical, not to examine related work of other scholars, detract from the usefulness of his book as a sourcebook for Peirce's main theories and doctrines. But as an account of Peirce's answer to nominalism and as a general account of Peirce's overall system of philosophy, Forster's book is a notable accomplishment.

[1] For a recent treatment of Peirce's conception of final causation, see T. L. Short, Peirce's Theory of Signs (Cambridge University Press, 2007).

[2] For a discussion of Peirce's theory of continuity see Hilary Putnam's "Comments on the Lectures" in Peirce's Reasoning and the Logic of Things, ed. Kenneth Laine Ketner (Cambridge, Harvard University Press, 1992).

[3] "The Fixation of Belief," Popular Science Monthly 12 (Nov. 1877): 1-15 and "How to Make Our Ideas Clear," Popular Science Monthly 12 (Jan. 1878): 286-302; these papers are reprinted, with variations, in Essential Peirce: Selected Philosophical Writings, vol. 1, eds. N. Houser and C. Kloesel (Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 1992), pp. 109-141.

[4] For critical examinations of Peirce's cosmology, see Andrew Reynolds, Peirce's Scientific Metaphysics (Vanderbilt University Press, 2002) and T. L. Short, Peirce's Theory of Signs (Cambridge University Press, 2007), Chs. 4 & 5, and Short's "Did Peirce Have a Cosmology?" Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society 46 (2010): 521-543.

[5] See "Pragmatism," in Essential Peirce: Selected Philosophical Writings, vol. 2, eds. Peirce Edition Project (Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 1998), pp. 398 -- 433.