Peirce on Perception and Reasoning: From Icons to Logic

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Kathleen A. Hull and Richard Kenneth Atkins (eds.), Peirce on Perception and Reasoning: From Icons to Logic, Routledge, 2017, 219 pp., $140 (hbk.), ISBN 9781138215016.

Reviewed by Jeff Kasser, Colorado State University


This volume collects thirteen papers derived from the Charles S. Peirce International Centennial Conference that took place in July 2014. The book aims "to explore Peirce's work on the function of icons, images, and diagrams in cognitive activities such as imagination, perception, inference, problem solving, and logic" (p. vii). It advertises itself as reflecting "a growing interest in American Pragmatism" (ibid). I do not know whether interest in pragmatism is growing, but I do fear that such an advertisement might needlessly cost the collection readers. For whatever reason, "pragmatism" invites people to take sides. While undeniably present and important, Peirce's pragmatism figures relatively modestly in this work. An interest in logic, aesthetics, or the philosophy of perception provides as good an entry point as an interest in pragmatism as such. Unsurprisingly, though, given their origin, the papers here primarily target the Peirce-initiated. When a phrase like "as is well known" occurs, Peirce scholars provide the reference class; among non-specialists, the correct spelling of "Peirce" is not widely known.

Papers about Peirce's theory of perception begin the volume, and papers about his diagrammatic logic end it. Since Peirce emphasized inferential aspects of perception and observational aspects of deductive reasoning, these bookends stand closer to each other than one might have expected. In between, the reader will find explorations and applications of the notion of iconicity. Those in the grip of the unfortunate preconception that semiotics is opposed in substance or temperament to analytic philosophy will find themselves surprised to see rich treatments of chemical pedagogy and of graphical literacy in advanced science education grouped with papers about gesture and mimesis. Any tolerably ecumenical philosopher trained in the analytic tradition will find most of the volume basically accessible and congenial.

A certain amount of repetition is a cost of doing business with a volume like this. Key passages from Peirce's writings recur frequently, as do some arguments and explanations. The reader is compensated for enduring redundancy, however, by the scope of the contributions and by receiving a vivid sense of how a central cluster of ideas can figure intriguingly in so many domains.

The major ingredients comprising Peirce's account of perception get presented both by Aaron Wilson (in the first essay) and by Catherine Legg (in the fourth). Peirce's work fits within the Reid-to-Chisholm-and-beyond trajectory of responses to the inadequacies of classical empiricist theories of perception, but he offers an intriguing variant within this tradition. Percepts are as close as Peirce comes to Humean impressions; they are intended to do justice to the phenomenological immediacy and richness, the insistency and specificity of perception. Wilson gives the example of "the visual awareness of the lines and shapes in front of you" when reading (p. 5). But percepts don't just fail to get themselves copied into perceptual judgments; they fail to resemble such judgments. Peirce anticipates the powerful coherentist dicta that anything that stands in no need of justification is incapable of providing justification and that no sense can be made of a judgment resembling something that is not a judgment. Since Peirce refuses to help himself to the dual causal and justificatory roles of ideas in classical empiricism, he so far has only a brute causal relationship between experience and judgment.

Despite some intriguing differences between them, Wilson and Legg both emphasize the role of a kind of reasonableness in the percipuum, the interpretive linkage of the percept and the perceptual judgment. As Legg clearly brings out, this is not the reasonableness of direct voluntary control. The percept, the perceptual judgment, and the percipuum (a word which helps explain why Peirce isn't more widely read) all force themselves upon the perceiver. Nevertheless, the habits through which I interpret, say, a friend's tone of voice are rationally assessable. As I become better informed, I can learn to hear a certain inflection as an expression of depression, rather than hostility. This results, Legg argues, in an "idealism operationalized;" habits which can be assessed as truth-conducive or not mediate between experience and judgment. Experience triggers thoughtful habits rather than causing copies of itself. She suggests that Peirce offers a superior alternative to Brandom's strong inferentialism, preserving Peirce's idea that "nothing at all . . . is absolutely confrontitional" while doing justice to the need for experience to make a distinctive contribution to thought (e.g. in accounting for de re beliefs).

Wilson, for his part, tries to reconcile Peirce's empiricism with his realism about universals and other abstracta typically unwelcome in empiricist ontologies. The reconciliation can be pulled off if one is willing to argue that universals and their ilk can be perceived, but that claim must be earned, not just attained by positing some faculty of intellectual intuition. Wilson carefully develops Peirce's in-principle permissible notion of perception. The mark of the perceptual, for Peirce, is that some intentional object is forced upon our mind as a kind of brute, non-reasonable fact. Nothing in such an account of perception prevents Peirce from claiming that those universals and generals that figure in true perceptual judgments can count as perceivable. Along the way, Wilson addresses a number of objections to the effect that Peirce's approach possesses all the advantages of theft over honest toil. Of particular interest is a worry about how, if at all, Peirce's central idea of perception-as-compulsion can avoid unduly broadening what counts as perceivable. I feel forced to recognize one of my dogs as male and one as female, but it is not clear that, while walking them, I perceive the sex of either animal any more than does the stranger who calls them both "good boys." Wilson ends with a strong claim, viz. that "perception is just uncontrollable thought, initiated by and directed upon our percepts" (p. 13). I wonder whether Legg would find such a position excessively inferentialist.

In his contribution, Richard Kenneth Atkins digs into the uncontrolled process that issues in percepts. He defends Peirce's claim that this process has the form of an abductive inference. Philosophers of science will benefit from Atkins' recapitulation of a recent debate among Peirce scholars about the nature of abduction. Is it an inference to the pursuitworthiness of an explanatory hypothesis? If so, to what extent does an abductive inference commit itself to the plausibility of the hypothesis? Or is abduction, on the other hand, merely the process of trying to guess, rather than to discern, the best explanation of relevant phenomena? Atkins argues that, in the case of perception, we can avoid this dilemma. Our perceptual equipment does not present us with competing explanatory hypotheses, so we need not assess their comparative plausibility. Our body generates a percept which emerges as pursuitworthy, at least prima facie. Atkins suggests that empirical work on optical illusions, synesthesia, and cognitive penetration highlights the ways in which perception involves "guesses or fallible insights into the way the world is" (p. 29). These cases exploit limitations, or other quirks, of our perceptual systems and, in that way, shed light on the nature of the quasi-inferences in question. He argues, for instance, that perceptual quasi-inferences (they are not full-fledged inferences because they are not subject to critical self-control) should be seen as abductive, rather than inductive, because they neither test hypotheses nor warrant assertions about matters of fact (p. 31). The dilemma at the heart of abduction seems to me to creep back in here. I think that Atkins conflates issues about the form and the strength of inductive (quasi-) inferences. An inference could be inductive in form without being strong enough to warrant assertion of its conclusion, which is why it is difficult to banish induction from the notion of a "fallible insight" into the nature of the world. Atkins is right, though, that Peirce tends to avow a restrictive conception of testing as involving predesignation and sampling, which makes it problematic to characterize the quasi-inference in question as inductive. Rounding out the first section, Evelyn Vargas compares Peirce's work on perception and inference to the more traditionally empiricist thought of William James.

In the volume's varied middle section, the closely connected notions of icons, images, and isomorphisms become central. The usual characterization of iconicity as signification via similarity suffers from unhelpfulness until more is said about similarity or resemblance. Peirce makes some headway here by thinking in information-theoretic terms. As Claudio Paolucci puts it, "the test for the iconicity of a sign rests in whether it is possible to manipulate the sign so that new information as to its object appears" (p. 75). A car's fuel gauge is iconic (though not merely iconic) even though the pointer's rightward position does not much resemble the fullness of the gas tank. Paolucci offers the most extensive development of a theme that several papers in this volume recognize, viz. the ways in which images like diagrams perform the function of Kant's Schemata. Icons bridge the particular and the general, the experiential and the propositional.

Iconicity is thus pivotal for Peirce's observational, and indeed experimental, conception of logic and mathematics, in which one manipulates diagrams in order to see and study the relations embodied therein. Peirce himself sometimes contrasts diagrammatic experiments with those in which substances themselves are studied. Peirce's exemplar of the latter kind of discipline is chemistry, in which he received his formal scientific training. Chiara Ambrosio and Chris Campbell delve into the teaching of chemistry in Peirce's time, complicating this contrast. Peirce's teachers characterized chemical formulas as "paper tools" and maintained that the importance of mathematics for chemistry derived as much from its effectiveness at presenting chemical relations visually as it did from quantification. Michael May further explores the functions of icons in scientific disciplines by diagnosing systematic mistakes made by advanced chemical engineering students. Seeing a graph as an image rather than as a diagram confuses similarity of qualities with similarity of relations. Seymour Simmons III also concerns himself with iconicity and pedagogy. He develops Peirce's ideas about visual and active intelligence into a case for the cognitive significance of drawing, one that bridges, in a principled way, disciplines seen as artistic and as scientific.

Rosella Fabbrichesi and Kelly Parker treat iconicity in more familiar contexts. Fabbrichesi links Peirce's theory of iconic signs to G.H. Mead's treatment of gestures, to Piero Sraffa's gestural objection to Wittgenstein's Tractatus, and to Foucault's discussion of parrhesia. She suggests that gestures show how a person, paradigmatically a philosopher, can embody or resemble the truth, where the truth is cashed out in terms of habits of action. Parker uses Peircean iconicity to clarify traditional Platonic and Aristotelian treatments of mimetic art, and thereby raises issues very similar to those that emerged in the discussion of chemical engineering education. Whether it is heat conduction or a landscape being represented, neither brute nor subjective similarities are being invoked. Instead, an intelligent assertion of identity of form is, at least implicitly, claimed. Identity of form in the service of a purpose, Parker argues, allows us to understand the place of mimesis in traditional representational art, in photography, and in abstract art.

The final three papers complete the move from the place of images in perception to their role in more abstract kinds of reasoning. At this point, however, the reader will understand why this is a short, if rather complex, journey for Peirceans. Christos Pechlivanidis explores the logic of Peircean abduction, raising issues that we have touched on when discussing Atkins above. Pechlivanidis insists that abduction has an irreducibly two-headed character, both as uncontrollable instinct and as rational inference. He finds a precursor in Aristotle's theory of the imagination which likewise refuses to insist that the imagistic is, as such, non-reasonable.

Kathleen Hull treats topology as "the bridge across the Kantian ravine between observation and deductive inference" (p. 147). In doing so, she joins a chorus, led by Fernando Zalamea, insisting that there is more to mathematics than is dreamt of in analytic philosophy thereof. While philosophers of science (try to) pay careful attention to the practice of mature empirical disciplines, analytic philosophy of math tends to ignore fields like topology in favor of an outdated picture of math as "deductive grammar." Hull argues that topological icons "carry no spatial meaning until they are rotated, manipulated, or put in bodily motion either physically (via a concrete model) or in imagination (via a diagram)" (p. 161). By insisting that topological information arises experientially but is used rigorously to generate and test mathematical claims, she articulates a role for intuition in mathematics that is importantly continuous with inference and argument. As Peirce shows in his Existential Graphs, formal arguments need not consist of propositions. Mathematics becomes the art and science of generating, perceiving, and transforming abstract structures.

Ahti-Veikko Pietarinen and Francesco Belluci close the volume by turning to Peirce's Existential Graphs, a diagrammatic or geometrical system of first-order logic, as distinct from the more familiar algebraic treatment which Peirce also helped develop. Theirs is the most demandingly Peircean paper in the collection. This is not because they presuppose familiarity with the Existential Graphs; they explain and motivate every use of the system. Rather, it is because they set out to clarify and temper some of the claims made about or on behalf of Peirce's diagrammatic logic. Many Peirceans want to convey a sense of what is distinctive about the Existential Graphs. Pietarinen and Belluci start from there and aspire to complicate the picture. They insist, first, that diagrams need not be visual. As Hull had also noted, there is an important tactile component to doing topology well; one should imagine one's body inhabiting and moving through the space in question. Nothing about the information-conveying definition of icons prevents there from being auditory or olfactory diagrams, despite our species' inclination toward vision. This general point, they argue, informs Peirce's philosophy of notation and undercuts claims that the Existential Graphs are essentially visual.

Next Pietarinen and Belluci put critical pressure on the notion of iconicity that I have been exploiting in a rather simple way. Much needs to be said, of course, about how and under what conditions the icon permits the extraction of information about its object. In addition, however, Peirce sometimes treats iconicity as a kind of naturalness or perspicuity. Can any clear sense be made of the idea that a system in which juxtaposition represents conjunction is more natural or more iconic than one in which it represents disjunction?

Whatever one thinks about pragmatism, this collection, though uneven in ambition and in execution, offers a path through some philosophical territory that is recognizable and inviting, but also a bit exotic and exciting.