Peirce's Pragmatic Theory of Inquiry: Fallibilism and Indeterminacy

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Elizabeth F. Cooke, Peirce's Pragmatic Theory of Inquiry: Fallibilism and Indeterminacy, Continuum, 2006, 174pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 0826488994.

Reviewed by Alexander Klein, University of Toronto


Peirce's Pragmatic Theory of Inquiry contends that the doctrine of fallibilism -- the view that any of one's current beliefs might be mistaken -- is at the heart of Peirce's philosophical project. Uncertainty is not just an attitude forced on us by unfortunate limitations of human cognition. Uncertainty is a necessary antecedent of all knowledge, for Peirce. This is because actual inquiry is the only source of Peircean knowledge. And we only inquire when we experience genuine uncertainty. So uncertainty about one's own beliefs is the engine under the hood of Peirce's epistemology -- it powers our production of knowledge. This is the sense in which fallibilism is at the heart of Peirce's project, according to Cooke (pp. 1-2, 30).

Chapters One and Two introduce Peirce's theory of inquiry and his critique of modern philosophy. The next three chapters deal with cases where Peirce appears to commit himself to limited forms of infallibilism -- in his account of mathematics (Chapter Three), in his account of the ideal limit towards which scientific inquiry is converging (Chapter Four), and in his metaphysics (Chapter Five). Chapter Six argues that Peircean fallibilism is superior to more recent "anti-realist" forms of fallibilism in epistemology. Cooke seeks to show how Peirce's "adaptationalistic" metaphysics makes provisions for a robust correspondence between ideas and world. Chapter Seven argues that hope is a second-order attitude required for Peircean, scientific inquiry.

Despite the importance of Peirce's professed fallibilism to his overall project (CP 1.13-14, 1897; 1.171, 1905), his fallibilism is difficult to square with some of his other celebrated doctrines. In his critique of Cartesian skepticism (CP 5.416, 1905; W 2.212, 1868; see Cooke, Chapters One and Four), his account of mathematical truths (CP 1.149, 1897; see Cooke, Chapter Three), and his account of the ultimate end of inquiry (W 3.273, 1878; see Cooke, Chapter Four), Peirce seems to stress the infallibility of some beliefs. The heart of Cooke's book is an attempt to grapple with some apparent tensions raised by Peirce's own commitment to fallibilism.

The tensions between Peirce's fallibilism and these other aspects of his project are well-known in the secondary literature. Unfortunately, it is not always clear how Cooke's solutions are either different from or preferable to solutions already available. Scholars like Susan Haack (Haack 1979), Christopher Hookway (Hookway 1985), and Cheryl Misak (Misak 1987; Misak 1991) in particular have all produced readings that diffuse these tensions in ways that are often clearer and more elegant than those on offer here, in my opinion.

For instance, consider the problem of mathematics. In an influential paper, Haack offered historical evidence that Peirce wavered on whether only our claims about the external world are fallible, or whether even our pure mathematical claims are fallible. She argued that Peirce need not have wavered, though. Whether there exist truths that are logically or mathematically necessary is independent of whether it is psychologically possible for us to mistakenly believe such truths to be false. In other words, Haack distinguished the objective or logical certainty of necessary propositions from our subjective or psychological certainty in believing those propositions. The Peircean fallibilist should accept that pure mathematics is objectively certain but should reject that it is subjectively certain, she argued (Haack 1979, esp. 52-53).

In contrast, Cooke's solution seems less satisfying. First, while Haack at least attempted to answer the historical question of what Peirce believed (he was frankly confused about whether math is fallible), Cooke simply takes a pass on this issue. After citing passages that appear to place mathematics "beyond the scope of fallibilism" (p. 57), Cooke writes that "it is neither our task here, nor perhaps even pos-sible, [sic] to reconcile these passages" (p. 58).

She then offers her own suggestion about what Peirce should have said. He should have distinguished "external" from "internal" fallibilism. "External fallibilism" is the view that when we make truth claims about existing things, we might be mistaken. "Internal fallibilism" is the view that we might be mistaken in judging a system of a priori claims to be internally consistent (p. 62).

But it is hard to see how this is supposed to solve the problem, for Peirce. Cooke first writes:

If Peirce were to allow for a completely consistent and coherent science, such as arithmetic, then he would also be committed to infallible truth, but it would not be infallible truth in the sense in which Peirce is really concerned in his doctrine of fallibilism. An extremely simple system (e.g., a simple syllogism) may give us infallible truth. But this admission does not pose a real threat to Peirce's universal fallibilism because mathematical truth does not give us truth about existing things. (p. 61)

This passage makes it sound as though the way to reconcile Peirce's fallibilism with his views on mathematics is to argue that Peirce should only have been a fallibilist about matters of fact -- he should only have been an "external fallibilist." This view contradicts Haack's well-known work (Haack 1979, esp. 44-45), so one might expect some argument backing up the position. But no argument is forthcoming.

What is more problematic (and more confusing) is that this view seems to contradict Cooke's own explanation of "internal fallibilism" a page later:

Internal fallibilism … is an openness to errors of internal inconsistency, and an openness to correcting them. Since human error is possible even in mathematical reasoning, Peirce would not want to call even mathematics absolutely certain or infallible, as we have seen. He would admit that there is always the possibility that an error has gone undetected for thousands of years. (p. 62)

Here it sounds as though Cooke agrees with Haack, that Peirce should say that we are subject to error even in our mathematical judgments. So, is Peirce supposed to be an "internal fallibilist," or not? It is frustratingly hard to discern Cooke's actual view. It is also difficult to figure out how Cooke's interpretation is supposed to revise or supplement existing interpretations of Peircean fallibilism. Is this "internal fallibilism" meant to be a cousin of Haack's subjective fallibilism? Is Cooke saying Peirce should have held that we can never achieve subjective (internal?) certainty, though we should admit that there are objective (externally?) necessary truths?

In short, Cooke's reading turns on solutions to problems that already have well-known solutions. The informed reader expects an explanation of why these solutions fall short, and a clearer presentation of Cooke's own alternative.

It is not that Cooke is unfamiliar with this work. She cites Haack's paper on Peirce's philosophy of math (at p. 158n.2). But she dismisses Haack's analysis by saying that

These two attributes of mathematics, i.e., it being necessary and fallible, are not mutually exclusive. Haack is persuasive in her argument. We do not think he [Peirce] sees a problem with the susceptibility of error in mathematics… . Peirce does extend fallibilism in this [sic] sense in which we are susceptible to error in mathematical reasoning, even though it is necessary reasoning.

This is a puzzling comment, since Cooke goes on to spend the chapter (entitled "Mathematics and Necessary Reasoning") addressing the very same problem Haack addressed -- whether Peirce ought to have extended his own fallibilism to necessary reasoning in mathematics.

Consider another case where Cooke offers a solution to a familiar problem in Peirce interpretation. Cooke acknowledges Misak's solution (Misak 1987; Misak 1991, 54-55) to the problem of how to reconcile the fallibilism that powers scientific inquiry, on one hand, with the apparent infallibilism involved in Peirce's critique of Cartesian or "paper doubt" on the other (p. 23). Misak's solution is to see the sort of anti-Cartesian infallibility with which we must regard the bulk of our beliefs as involving only "practical certainty," for Peirce, not absolute or theoretical certainty. Cooke promises that "more will be said on this distinction in Chapter 4." But then in Chapter Four we get a lengthy discussion of the aforementioned tension, but no explanation of why we should not just be happy with Misak's (already-cited) solution.

In short, influential solutions to the problems with which Cooke is dealing are often cited, but then brushed aside without sufficient explanation about why these solutions will not work.

Cooke is at her best in polemical sections towards the end of the book, particularly in passages dealing with Joseph Margolis and Richard Rorty. These criticisms show sound instincts, but in my view she ultimately overreaches, imputing views to Peirce that sound implausible.

For instance, she shows sound instincts when she portrays Peirce as offering a compelling alternative to Rorty's "anti-realist" form of pragmatism. But she falls flat, in my view, when she instead tries to portray Peirce as a kind of transcendentalist. (Here she acknowledges a debt to Sami Pihlström's recent attempts to synthesize "the transcendental Kantian project with pragmatic naturalism," p. 129.)

Rorty argued that "'hope,' rather than 'truth,' is the proper goal of inquiry" (p. 144). Cooke rightly calls attention to the long history of the concept hope figuring into pragmatist accounts of inquiry, a history that traces back to Peirce (pp. 144-145). And contra Rorty, she rightly seeks to show that the concept of hope, at least for Peirce, is intimately connected with the prospect of gaining real knowledge through inquiry.

But her attempt to read Peirce as a Kantian on this issue overreaches. She argues that hope is a transcendental precondition for entering into genuine inquiry, for Peirce.

One begins (or furthers) inquiry into an unknown area by asking a genuine question, and in doing so, one logically presupposes that the question has an answer, and can and will be answered with further inquiry. (p. 136)

It is one thing to say that inquiry cannot begin unless one at least hopes one can get an answer. But Cooke thinks Peirce held that inquiry cannot begin unless one's question actually "will be answered with further inquiry." She seems to hold that there is a performative contradiction (on which, see pp. 123-124) in asking a question that will not actually be answered. This is an extremely strong claim, and she repeats it several times.

In the present argument, the "answerability of a question" is what is logically entailed in the very asking of it. (pp. 138-139)

She is careful to say that we can ask a question without believing that it will be answered. But this just gets us into deeper water:

Of course, the presupposition ["… of the answerability of a question"] may not be "held" by the inquirer at all. The transcendental argument claims the presupposition is logically entailed -- not that it is actually believed or hoped … (p. 139)

So, if one asks a genuine question, this logically entails that an answer will be found, Cooke seems to hold.

It is hard to discern reasons for believing this strong claim. Somehow, she thinks that the "answerability of a question" is indispensable to genuine inquiry -- there cannot be genuine inquiry unless our question actually can be answered. But Peirce himself was clear that indispensability is not a reason for thinking some proposition actually true (see Misak 1991, 140-141).

I do not admit that indispensability is any ground of belief. It may be indispensable that I should have $500 in the bank -- because I have given checks to that amount. But I have never found that the indispensability directly affected my balance, in the least. (CP 2.113, 1901)

Instead, Peirce wrote that when we conduct inquiry, we make whatever hopeful assumptions are needed

… for the same reason that a general who has to capture a position or see his country ruined, must go on the hypothesis that there is some way in which he can and shall capture it. (CP 7.219, 1901)

This does not sound like a philosopher who thinks that because genuine inquiry requires an antecedent presumption that success is possible, success really is inevitable, eventually.

One final aspect of the book deserves comment. On one hand, this book is very much a rational reconstruction of Peirce's views and is relatively less concerned with the historical context in which Peirce wrote. Cooke professes to be interested in the logic of the views themselves -- what Peirce ought to have been up to, not (necessarily) what Peirce was up to (p. 2). This seems fair enough -- certainly much well-respected scholarship on the history of philosophy takes this approach.

But on the other hand, she approvingly and repeatedly quotes Peirce's claim that all inquiry must be motivated by actual doubts some human really holds:

The irritation of doubt … results in a suspension of the individual's previously held habit of action. Since the doubt is an irritation and since it causes a suspension of action, the individual works to rid herself of the doubt through inquiry. The doubt motivates the inquiry and gives the inquiry its purpose. The particular purpose of each inquiry is dictated by the particular doubt which has arisen for the individual. (p. 22)

Actual doubt gives inquiry its purpose, according to Cooke's Peirce (also see p. 49). So if Peirce's view is correct, then the purpose of his own philosophical inquiries must have been "dictated by" some "particular doubt."

But what was the purpose of Peirce's inquiry? What sort of living doubt actually motivated him to spend his time developing fallibilist theories in epistemology and metaphysics, of all things? Rational reconstructions leave such questions unanswered.

Pragmatists cannot brush off issues like this as merely biographical, or claim to be interested (per rational reconstruction) in the context of justification rather than in the context of discovery. For Cooke is right -- pragmatists insist that inquiry gets its very purpose from the inquirer's experience of doubt. If this view is correct, then one cannot understand the purpose of an intellectual project purely from inside the supposed context of justification. One must roll up one's sleeves and do some intellectual history in order to figure out what actual doubt -- doubt experienced by real, historical people -- actually motivated that project in the first place. I suggest that one ought to expect all sympathetic historians of pragmatism -- not just Cooke, in fairness -- to provide historical accounts of what motivated the philosophical work of their subjects.

Indeed, Peirce's life history makes questions about the point of his philosophy especially puzzling. He spent much of his life in financial hardship, ostracized from the academic community of late-Victorian America. For instance, one of the essays on which Cooke heavily relies -- "The First Rule of Logic" -- was one in a lecture series delivered in Cambridge. Peirce had not eaten for three days when William James intervened, organizing these lectures as a way to raise money for his struggling old friend (Menand 2001, 349-351). Stories like this make one wonder why on earth a starving, ostracized man like Peirce should have spent his time developing an epistemology and metaphysics. What did he hope to accomplish?

In short, rational reconstruction leaves us with little idea how to evaluate Peirce's work. This is because such reconstruction leaves unclear what Peirce wanted that work to accomplish. Cooke reads Peirce, I think, because she thinks his writings will help us to solve certain shortcomings of contemporary epistemology. She is eager to develop a pragmatist epistemology that secures a more robust realism about the external world than contemporary varieties of coherentism -- an admirable goal, even if I have found fault with her means of achieving it. But it is hard to know how Peirce can help us if we do not pause to ask harder historical questions about what kinds of doubts actually motivated his philosophical project -- and thus, what he hoped his philosophy would accomplish, in the end.

References to Peirce

CP (Peirce 1931-1958)

W (Peirce 1982-)

Works Cited

Haack, Susan (1979), "Fallibilism and Necessity", Synthese 41:37-64.

Hookway, Christopher (1985), Peirce. London: Routledge & Kegan Paul.

Menand, Louis (2001), The Metaphysical Club: A Story of Ideas in America. New York: Farrar, Straus, and Giroux.

Misak, Cheryl J. (1987), "Peirce, Levi, and the Aims of Inquiry", Philosophy of Science 54:256-265.

 --- (1991), Truth and the End of Inquiry: A Peircean Account of Truth. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Peirce, Charles S. (1931-1958), Collected Papers. Edited by Charles Hartshorne, Paul Weiss and Ardath W. Burks. 8 vols. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

---, (1982-), Writings of Charles S. Peirce: A Chronological Edition. Edited by Max H. Fisch and Christian J. W. Kloesel. Bloomington: Indiana University Press.