Peirce's Theory of Signs

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T. L. Short, Peirce's Theory of Signs, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 374pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521843201.

Reviewed by Cheryl Misak, University of Toronto


Thomas Short has not only given us a careful and beautifully written account of Peirce's theory of signs -- he has given us a bracing tonic. Here is his first sentence: 'Peirce's theory of signs, or semeiotic, misunderstood by so many, has gotten in amongst the wrong crowd'. That crowd is the 'interdisciplinary army of semioticians whose views and aims are antithetical to Peirce's own'.

How true and how good it is to finally have an excellent guide through the thicket that is Peirce's important work on signs. Short is an excellent interpreter of Peirce's sometimes bewildering array of notes for systematic books, partial drafts of papers, letters, and scribbles. We finally have a careful and accurate account of how Peirce's many classifications of signs (always coming in threes) are linked together and linked with the big philosophical issues he was immersed in -- the issues swirling around meaning, reference, naturalism, realism, and truth.

The semioticians have indeed had a field day with Peirce's taxonomy of signs: icon/ index/symbol; sign/object/interpretant; qualisign/sinsign/legisign; rheme/dicisign/argument … in total sixty-six classes. But what is required in order to appreciate what is valuable in these classifications is a sorting through of the mass of detail and a bringing to the surface of Peirce's insights. This is exactly what Short does. He shows how Peirce took his theory of signs to be central to providing a naturalist but non-reductive account of the mind and to providing an account of scientific inquiry that has it yielding knowledge of an independent reality. Along the way, he shows how Peirce grounds the theory of signs in phenomenology; he offers us deeply interesting suggestions about how emotion might be cognitive; and he shows how Peirce anticipated the holistic account of meaning we later find in Feyerabend and Kuhn. Throughout, there is a constant and heartening engagement with contemporary positions in the philosophy of mind, language, and science, linking Peirce's work to views that grip us today.

That said, this is a book for the scholar. There is a short and helpful section in the preface which maps the alternatives to Short's view and aligns others with his view. (I was especially pleased to see John Fitzgerald's early book cited favorably and some of his insights resurrected.) But, on the whole, working through Peirce's theory of signs is a taxing job and it is the scholar who will be thanking Short, not the philosopher who wants a snapshot of Peirce's theory of signs. Indeed, this is Short's conclusion after trying to make sense of the complexity: 'For all the enthusiasm that Peirce's later taxonomy has elicited, with its promise of a vast system, an endlessly ramifying formal structure that applies everywhere and to everything, close examination of it disappoints. It is sketchy, tentative, and, as best I can make out, incoherent.' (260) However, Short notes that Peirce fares no worse here than Austin's How to Do Things with Words and Goodman's Languages of Art.

Short sees a sharp break between Peirce's early work on signs and his more mature work. He very nicely shows how the 1868 doctrine was 'deeply flawed' and how Peirce recognized the flaws and corrected them by 1907. As someone who spent a memorable year trying to make sense of Peirce's 1867 Kantian 'On a New List of Categories' and then trying to link the thoughts uncovered in it to Peirce's later work on signs, this was an especially welcome thought. Contrary to the views of some Peirce scholars, 'The New List', Short tells us, is a stepping stone, not a keystone, for Peirce. (32)

He also takes on the issue (240f) of what Peirce means when he uses the language of 'determination': nothing can determine anything of a higher category than itself; a sign is determined by its object; a sign determines an interpretant, etc. This kind of thought is central to understanding Peirce's work on signs and Short cuts through some fuzziness of previous readings, giving us what is in my view the first sustained and proper treatment of the matter.

The importance of Peirce's theory of signs, Short argues, is not its formal elaboration of principles, nor is it its taxonomy of kinds of signs. Its importance lies in the project it defines: the critical examination of proposed principles and the painstaking application of them to particular cases, so that a coherent and illuminating system is achieved. (260)

At the heart of Peirce's theory of signs is the idea of interpretation. Peirce argued that the sign-referent relation is not able, on its own, to uphold a complete account of representation. Representation, he argued, is triadic -- it involves a sign, an object, and an interpreter. Each aspect of the representation relation -- sign, object, interpreter -- resonates with one of the elements in Peirce's core division of signs in terms of icons, indices, and symbols. An icon is a sign that exhibits its object by virtue of a similarity or resemblance -- a portrait is an icon of the person it portrays and a map is an icon of a particular geographical area. An index is a sign that exhibits its object in a causal way -- as Peirce put it, an index signifies an object by being really connected to it. A symptom is an index of a disease and smoke is an index of fire. The essential quality of an index is its ability to compel attention. A pointing finger, a knock on the door, or a demonstrative pronoun such as 'there' or 'that' draws attention to its object by getting the interpreter to focus on it. A symbol, finally, is a sign because it is used and understood as such -- it depends upon a conventional rule.

Much of the interest in Peirce's theory of signs, for philosophers rather than for semioticians, centers around the concept of meaning. For of course one of Peirce's great contributions to philosophy is the idea of pragmatic meaning -- the idea that part of the meaning of an intellectual sign (a belief or a statement, for instance) lies in its consequences. When Peirce connects the issues of meaning and pragmatism to his theory of signs, he locates these matters in the domain of 'interpretants', or what Short very helpfully calls 'responses'.

Short notes that Peirce's central thought is that in order to represent something, a sign has to be employed with purpose. This thought, of course, is dear to the entire pragmatist tradition. Short goes on to argue that the mark of purposefulness is the possibility of error. (157) Then he uses the kinds of mistakes that can be made as his chief tool to examine Peirce's distinctions in the 1900s between kinds of interpretants. 'The crux of the matter', says Short, is that a response is part of a purposeful course of behavior and, as such, must take place on a basis that justifies it relative to its purpose. (158) Peirce argued that symbols grow through use and experience, and here we have his pragmatism and theory of truth making its appearance.

One of Peirce's central divisions of kinds of interpretants or responses is as follows. The immediate interpretant is the interpretability of the sign; the dynamic interpretant is any actual interpretant formed, and the final interpretant is the ideal interpretation of that sign for its purpose. Short cuts through the countless misinterpretations, some of them understandable and forgivable, and through Peirce's varying accounts and failed experiments. He gives us a compelling and coherent account of how Peirce identifies truth with final interpretants (57) and pragmatic meaning with a kind of dynamical interpretant -- what he called an ultimate logical interpretant or a habit change.

Interestingly, for a book on Peirce's theory of signs, Short spends as much time on the topic of truth as he does on pragmatism. This is fitting, since one of Peirce's other great contributions to philosophy is the idea that truth is that which would be indefeasible or not defeated by argument and experience, no matter how far we pressed our inquiries.

He also spends much time on a neglected topic -- the affinity between Peirce's theory of signs and the theory of rigid designation and natural kinds put forward by Kripke, Putnam, and others. Here is the central idea, articulated by a young Peirce and maintained throughout his life: 'I believe in mooring our words by certain applications and letting them change their meaning as our conceptions of the things to which we have applied them progress.' (264) With Kripke and Putnam, Peirce argues that a natural kind term is moored -- is a rigid designator -- because of the way it was first introduced. Short has an excellent discussion of scholastic abstraction and vagueness, showing how Peirce envisioned this introduction. It is too nuanced and complex to set out here, but what is important is that the introduction 'is the connecting thread of all the subsequent inquiry in which we seek more specific knowledge of the referent'. (287) Then Peirce puts some distance between meaning and reference, allowing for an account of theory change that betters the current models.

A term's reference, that is, is not fixed by its meaning. It is fixed by indexical signification. But as Peirce put it later, symbols grow -- the meaning of a term can change with the growth of knowledge. Short suggests that this undercuts the thought that philosophy is conceptual analysis: 'The point is not to understand our meanings, but to change them'. (264) Meaning is inexhaustible and its explication is never complete. (58)

I would have liked to see here some discussion of Christopher Hookway's allied thought. Hookway suggests, in Truth, Rationality and Pragmatism (Oxford University Press 2000: 57f) that Peirce had a deeply interesting view of vagueness which solves some pressing problems about preservation of meaning through theory change. He argued that Peirce's theory of truth has it that when we assert that P is true, we commit ourselves to experience falling in line with P or with some successor of P. Hence the content of what we commit ourselves to is indeterminate. The concept of mass, for instance, has undergone radical revision over time, but we can still think that both Newton and contemporary physicists are referring to the same thing when they talk of mass. Newton was committed not to having his precise belief about mass survive the rigors of inquiry, but rather some successor of his belief. In this way, we can refer to individuals and to kinds without fully understanding their character. Theory change can be seen as precision-making moves within a vague picture. Earlier views present a partial grasp of a complex reality. Indexical reference anchors our beliefs to the world -- it explains how we can have beliefs and theories about x, despite the fact that we are getting much wrong. Given that Short's illuminating discussions of Peirce on vagueness, rigid designation, and theory change have some resonance with Hookway's view, it would be good to have had the discussion enriched by a consideration of Hookway's insights.

Peirce's thought that symbols grow through use and experience clearly provides the link between Peirce's theory of signs and his theory of truth. The connection is unsurprising, given what Peirce called the 'architectonic' nature of his work. The theory of signs is connected to most of Peirce's other important views. Thus Short turns towards Peirce's epistemology and philosophy of science. What is mostly a book for those interested in the technicalities of Peirce's theory of signs becomes, at the end, a book for anyone interested in what Peirce has to say about truth, science, and the fixation of belief.

Short's account of Peirce's famous 'The Fixation of Belief' is excellent. He notes the apparent oddity of Peirce's argument: Peirce begins by denying that inquiry aims at truth or at anything but the local fixation of belief, and ends by affirming the method of science, which entails an endless postponement of the fixation of belief. (331) He rightly nails down Peirce's intention in this paper as being to discover what it is that we really do aim at -- what it is that really will satisfy us. (Short's reading here has affinities with David Wiggins' difficult but brilliant 'Reflections on Inquiry and Truth Arising from Peirce's Method for the Fixation of Belief' in The Cambridge Companion to Peirce, and again, one wishes that there had been some comparative discussion.) The argument of 'The Fixation' is an argument about how the conception of truth gradually develops: from truth being simply what I believe; to its being what an authority tells us to believe; to its being what we find natural to believe; to, finally, its being what experience would eventually compel us to believe. Only when we get to this last view of truth do we have a concept that makes truth, as Peirce said, independent of the vagaries of you, me or any collection of men.

Short gives us, in his last chapter, a compelling interpretation of how Peirce took scientific inquiry to be objective, despite being theory-laden; of how he argued that despite the fact that there are no incorrigible foundations for knowledge, we can have knowledge. The trail of the human serpent is over everything, as Peirce's friend and fellow pragmatist William James said. But (as James may or may not have himself seen) this does not toss us into the sea of post-modern arbitrariness, where truth varies from person to person and culture to culture. How better to wrap up than with Short's own concluding words:

… we have no knowledge a priori of how to inquire -- there can never be a time when we will know, for sure, that we are proceeding in the right way or even that there is a right way to proceed. We can only go by the evidence we have so far acquired, in faith that there is an impersonal truth, that is, a final opinion toward which an ideal inquiry would tend. The evidence that supports that faith is extensive and compelling and yet conceivably erroneous. It is shot through with uncertainty, unanswered questions, unresolved problems, and vague formulations. (347)


That is as good a statement as there is to be found of the essence of Peircean pragmatism.