Peirce's Speculative Grammar: Logic as Semiotics

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Francesco Bellucci, Peirce's Speculative Grammar: Logic as Semiotics, Routledge, 2018, 388 pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415793506.

Reviewed by Mats Bergman, University of Helsinki


Francesco Bellucci offers an erudite exposition of the fundaments of Charles S. Peirce's philosophical theory of signs. His study is both highly ambitious and rigorously delimited, seeking to reconstruct the logical character and systematic development of Peirce's semiotic grammar by means of close readings of the original texts. The book is organised chronologically, setting out from Peirce's first explicit references to "general grammar" in the mid-1860s and closing with his final observations on the theory of signs around 1910. This is thus a distinctly exegetical undertaking, which ought to be of interest for theoretical semioticians and historians of logic, but which is primarily geared towards seasoned Peirce scholars.

Bellucci is clear about the boundaries of his undertaking. The book is not meant to offer an appraisal of the soundness or fruitfulness of the ideas discussed, and it does not scrutinise their potential implications for contemporary debates. With a few exceptions, Bellucci sticks closely to this script: his project is to be understood as a "historical reconstruction" that aims to uncover "internal justifications" for the evolution of Peirce's grammar (p. 10). And the principal -- if not only -- rationale for semiotic that Bellucci recognises is that of the advancement of the logical study of reasoning.

As such, the observation that Peircean semiotic is closely correlated with Peircean logic is neither novel nor particularly controversial. In agreement with Max Fisch, Bellucci maintains that Peirce progresses from an early delimitation of logic as a division of semiotic to a broader definition of logic as a general theory of signs. However, Bellucci qualifies this developmental story by arguing that what "we perceive as Peirce's mature semiotics -- which in the main consists in his various, successive attempts at a general classification of signs -- is speculative grammar, which is subordinate, and not superordinate, to logic" (p. 5). By thus asserting the priority of the "logical horizon", Bellucci appears to contradict Peirce's late-period position, in which logic (in the narrower "critical" sense) is regarded as dependent on grammar. However, he is not out to undermine Peirce's "rational arrangement", which is based on the idea that more specialised disciplines receive "principles" from more general ones, but not vice versa. Rather, Bellucci avers that Peirce's semiotic is always subservient to the more traditional objectives of logic.

Nonetheless, Bellucci concedes that there is a sense in which logic as a whole can be construed as semiotic, "because logic is the study of arguments, and arguments are signs" (p. 5). This involves some terminological ambiguities, which are not satisfactorily resolved by Bellucci's insistence that the grammatical department is "eminently" semiotic. At times, it is difficult to make out what sense of "logic" really is at issue; and it remains somewhat unclear whether his broader conception of semiotic also covers the third branch of Peircean logic -- that is, "speculative rhetoric" or "methodeutic". One possible solution would be to group grammar and logic together as formal semiotic, distinguished from the more "material" concerns that are pursued in rhetoric/methodeutic. Bellucci suggests as much (p. 155), but the distinction is not systematically developed -- perhaps because it is difficult to uphold on strictly exegetical grounds. Instead, his speculative grammar appears to subtly take over a part of semiotic that one would expect to be assigned to speculative rhetoric, as he describes the former as an investigation of "the objective conditions that a sign must fulfill in order to convey any meaning" (p. 193; emphasis added) rather than as a study of the conditions for embodiment of meaning (as Peirce more commonly says). In so doing, Bellucci seems to downplay definitions where rhetoric/methodeutic is characterised as inquiry into the conditions of the ways in which signs may determine "interpretants". Instead, he favours a conception of the third branch as a secondary "doctrine of methods", which -- in contrast to critical logic -- seems to have no impact on grammatical semiotic.

Bellucci's priority of logic thesis receives some backing from the way Peirce justifies the enlargement of logical inquiry in his later philosophy (surveyed in the concluding chapter). For on the one hand, Peirce argues that logicians ought to investigate the entire sphere of signs because no other scientific group is as well-positioned to take on the task at hand; but on the other, he maintains that they should do so in order to better delimit and advance their primary pursuit of a theory of reasoning. It remains an open question whether this sets definite boundaries for semiotic, but it is hardly deniable that the philosophical theory of signs is primarily a logical pursuit in the mature Peircean framework.

Yet, the weightiest support for Bellucci's reading does not stem from such pitches for a grammatically augmented conception of logical work, but rather from the contention that the inception and subsequent advances of speculative grammar are to be comprehended as products of Peirce's attempts to address specific logical issues. Peirce does not engage in explicitly grammatical inquiry until the final phases of his philosophical labours, but Bellucci submits that we can detect "an implicit treatment of speculative grammar" in key parts of Peirce's earlier production (p. 3). In practice, this requires construing Peirce's embryonic semiotic classifications as grammatical pursuits.

Bellucci's reconstructive method is put to fecund use in chapter one. Via illuminating analyses of how Peirce's nascent theory of signs develops in tandem with his work on the classification of arguments and their leading principles, Bellucci can plausibly lay out the initial steps toward a "doctrine" of speculative grammar, culminating in the rudimentary classification of signs presented in the 1867 article 'On a New List of Categories'. Here, Bellucci frames his analysis as an explication of the so-called "reduction of illation to sign relation" -- that is, Peirce's purported "discovery that in an argument the premises are a sign of the conclusion" (pp. 16-17). Towards the end of the book, Bellucci avers that this fundamental "reduction", which he characterises as "a discovery of logical critics", substantiates Peirce's contention that logic as a whole ought to be regarded as semiotic (p. 360). If correct, this reading provides Bellucci with a neat justification for the priority of the logic standpoint. However, as the claim that Peirce's numerous efforts to define "sign" actually constitute attempts to formulate the logical leading principle of inference (p. 48) is not sufficiently corroborated, I still have reservations about the implied equivalence between the semiotic and the inferential.

In this exegesis, Bellucci seeks to avoid the tendency to interpret the early theory of signs in light of the mature system. Rather, he strives to explain certain later developments as efforts to address logical issues left open or produced by previous positions (p. 11). Judicious as this strategy is, it runs the reverse risk of projecting early viewpoints onto later ideas with debatable consequences -- e.g. the suggestion that Peirce at all times identifies "mental concepts" with "natural symbols" (p. 65). This contention seems to be supported by a single early text, in which Peirce submits that certain symbols -- including hieroglyphs and "conceptions or mental symbols" -- possess an original representative nature near to that of icons. The additional evidence that Bellucci rolls out only shows that Peirce continues to affirm that symbols can be either natural or conventional, and provides no compelling reasons to equate Peirce's mature conception of natural symbols with mental concepts.

Despite Bellucci's exegetical prudence, I feel that he sometimes lets his overarching explanatory model overdetermine and oversimplify his readings -- something that can arguably be discerned in his treatment of the early relationship between logic and the theory of categories. Appealing to a somewhat nebulous "order of priority among philosophical tasks", Bellucci maintains that Peirce "must already be in possession of a classification of arguments drawn in terms of a classification of signs" before taking on the theory of categories (p. 71). However, that is not convincingly demonstrated. Here, Bellucci also seems to neglect the chronological antecedence of Peirce's interest in the theory of categories, which -- along with the fact that the earliest inklings of sign classification appear in the 1861-62 paper 'Treatise on Metaphysics' -- casts at least some doubt on the notion that Peircean semiotic would be a product of nothing but logical needs.

In comparison with Bellucci's focused account of the beginnings of Peirce's semiotic, chapter two feels a bit disjointed. Ostensibly surveying Peirce's unsuccessful attempt to produce a book on logic in the early 1870s, this treatment also looks backward to Peirce's late-1860s cognition articles and forward to the well-known pragmatistic essays published some ten years later. The ensuing deliberations include many insights, but it is sometimes difficult to get a firm grip on how Bellucci perceives their relations to speculative grammar. This is especially true of positions usually associated with Peirce's pragmatism, such as the belief-doubt model of inquiry and the pragmatistic method for elucidating conceptual meaning -- which, for the mature Peirce, at least, is a matter of methodeutic.

In the third chapter, Bellucci locates a "doctrine of speculative grammar" in Peirce's 1885 article 'On the Algebra of Logic'. This feels a bit exaggerated, since the treatment in question is in fact a fairly short section on the kinds of signs usually designated "icon", "index", and "symbol". However, Bellucci accomplishes two noteworthy things here. First, he carefully documents the formal-logical background and context of the 1885 "grammar". Second, he shows how the preliminary investigation of the three semiotic elements serves to explicate the composition of propositions/assertions, understood as central elements of deductive arguments. This lends some support to Bellucci's priority of logic thesis. Moreover, although he maintains that speculative grammar grows from an analysis of the constituents of propositions to a general classification of all kinds of signs in the early 1900s, it is evident that propositional representations remain a focal point in his reconstruction of Peirce's later semiotic.

In the following four chapters, Bellucci charts the path of Peircean grammar to its most coherent articulation in A Syllabus of Certain Topics of Logic (1903). Here, he identifies two significant reforms of speculative grammar, which enable Peirce to establish a ten-class taxonomy of signs. Although not in all respects novel, Bellucci's methodical discussion of this progression constitutes the most solid part of his exegesis. He is truly at his forte in the detailed reconstruction of the probable order of composition of the Syllabus grammar. By paying close attention to significant differences between consequent drafts that are often conflated, Bellucci can plausibly explain certain apparent inconsistencies in Peirce's positions. This is not entirely uncontroversial, however, for Bellucci submits that the notion of "hypoicon" -- that is, a sign whose mode of representation is mainly iconic -- is only a "temporary stratagem" that is not needed in the more systematic classification of signs (p. 230). If he is right, then many analyses of Peirce's conception of iconicity have been severely misguided.

The final developments of speculative grammar (discussed in chapter eight) constitute a colossal challenge for the interpreter. Peirce's semiotic grows rapidly, but these changes emerge mainly in unfinished manuscripts, experimental notebook entries, and fragmentary correspondence. Many scholars have become captivated by this potentially fertile but problematic phase -- and especially by the 66-class system that Peirce envisioned. In these notoriously perilous terrains, Bellucci adopts a cautious stance, stating that he is "not concerned with finishing what Peirce left unfinished" (p. 352). This seems like a sensible approach, but it is not always easy to sustain. As he documents minute changes in ideas and terminology, Bellucci faces the challenges involved in trying to put together a puzzle with many mismatched and missing pieces, and he ends up streamlining certain aspects of Peirce's semiotic. To some extent, this is inevitable; but there are instances where I believe that Bellucci does not sufficiently consider contradictory evidence. For example, he confidently asserts that only propositions and proposition-like signs have so-called "immediate objects" (p. 294) -- that is, objects that are in some sense internal to the representation afforded by the sign, in distinction from the "dynamical" aspect of the object. This contention is backed up by Peirce's tentative suggestion that signs can be classified as vague, singular, and general according to the mode of the immediate object -- a partition that bears more than passing resemblance to the traditional division of propositions according to quantity. However, the existence of such a lineage does not suffice to prove that Peirce would hold that terms or "rhemas" lack immediate objects. Whatever analytical merits Bellucci's reconstruction may possess, it is dubious from a strictly exegetical point of view. When Peirce directly addresses the matter at hand -- e.g. in a 1907 letter to Giovanni Papini -- his position is that all signs necessarily have immediate objects, while some lack real dynamical objects.

There are also aspects of Bellucci's reconstruction that at least look like stabs at filling in gaps in Peirce's mature grammar. A substantial part of chapter eight is dedicated to an effort to map conceptions stemming from Peirce's tentative interpretant-divisions onto later speech-act theory. Attempting to stay true to his exegetical rationale, Bellucci ends up spotting and shifting illocutionary and perlocutionary components based on rather meagre terminological hints. This is not to say that such a formal classification of speech acts would be impossible; but I suspect that a plausible development of a theory of interpretants and semiotic acts cannot be achieved by formal grammar alone.

In light of such considerations, I feel that Peirce's characterisation of semiotic as the "a priori" theory of signs would have deserved a more thorough critical scrutiny in this book. While Bellucci takes note of Peirce's underdeveloped suggestion that semiotic inquiry involves an interplay between the deductive (a priori) and the "rhetorical" method (pp. 156-157, 341), the possibility that semiotic experience and more "material" needs may not only act as checks on but also as guides for grammatical developments is not systematically probed. Bellucci does not consider Peirce's occasional profession that logic is developed for methodeutic; and the story might be further complicated by less obvious influences on the advance of semiotic, such as Peirce's forays into evolutionary "objective logic".

However, it would be unreasonable to expect any explication of Peirce's semiotic to cover all its potential sources and implications. In fact, in this review I have not been able to do justice to the depth and reach of Bellucci's book, which within its self-imposed boundaries manages to address such abstruse matters as Peirce's account of dyadic relations, his system of existential graphs, and the link of his ideas to Ockham and the Modistae. The criticisms voiced above notwithstanding, Bellucci's endeavour constitutes a significant contribution to Peirce studies. Owing to his firm focus, Bellucci succeeds in providing the most detailed account of Peirce's speculative grammar to date. While I believe that Bellucci's exegesis involves stronger suppositions than he lets on, it reveals many logical aspects of Peircean semiotic that have been unjustly neglected in previous research. And although Bellucci does not really tell us why Peircean semiotic would be something worth pursuing today, he provides us with a logical path into the bounteous -- but often disorienting -- world of Peirce's theory of signs. That is no mean feat.