Perceiving the World

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Bence Nanay (ed.), Perceiving the World, Oxford University Press, 2010, 377pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195386196.

Reviewed by John Maier, The Australian National University


This volume consists of eleven essays on perception and an introduction by the editor. The authors are prominent figures in the field, and the level of discussion is high. It is a valuable contribution to the philosophy of perception and cognate areas.

As its somewhat anodyne title suggests, there is not much to unify these essays beyond the fact that they all concern, in one way or other, perception. Nonetheless, certain themes recur. One leitmotif is concern about the contents of perception. This concern may be divided into two questions. First, there is the foundational question: does visual perception necessarily involve a relation to representational content? Second, there is the extensional question: what exactly is represented in the contents of visual experience? (Note the restriction in both questions to visual perception: almost all of the discussion in this volume sets to one side the other perceptual modalities). Eight of the essays in this volume address at least one of these questions. I begin with these eight essays, and return at the end to three essays whose concerns do not fit neatly into this taxonomy. I conclude by discussing the editor’s introduction and the suggestive remarks he makes there about this field and its future.

Adam Pautz and Susanna Siegel both offer arguments on behalf of an affirmative answer to the foundational question: visual perception does necessarily involve a relation to representational content. Pautz defends what he calls the “intentional view,” according to which "all visual experience properties are at least partly identical with properties of the form standing in a relation R to content C involving external properties P, Q, R …" (257). Among the many opponents to such a view that he discusses, the one who comes in for the most discussion is the disjunctivist, who argues that, at least in a case that involves no illusion or hallucination, visual experience involves a relation to “an item that is very different from an intentional content, namely, an actual state of the world” (291). Much of the interest of this essay lies in the care and sympathy with which Pautz discusses this opponent’s view. He is careful to distinguish and articulate the many versions that disjunctivism might take, and he compellingly argues that the strongest motivation for such a view, one that arises prior to some of the more sophisticated considerations that have been raised in the literature, is the naive intuition that when one sees a tomato in good circumstances one is having the visual experience one has “by virtue of simply seeing the redness and roundness of the tomato” (294). In the end, Pautz’s argument for the intentional view over what he takes to be the most plausible form of disjunctivism takes the form of an inference to the best explanation. He argues that the most plausible disjunctivism must admit that visual experience at least sometimes involves a relation to content (namely, in cases of illusion and hallucination), and that the simplest explanation of this fact is the intentionalist view that visual experience necessarily involves a relation to content. “The best argument against” the most plausible disjunctivist views, Pautz claims, “is simply that they are peculiar and complicated” (299). Whether the reader agrees with Pautz here will depend on how she views the competing virtues of intuitive acceptability and explanatory simplicity.

Whereas Pautz’s argument is an inference to the best explanation, Siegel’s is deductive in form. Siegel argues for what she calls the “Content View,” according to which “all visual experiences have contents” (334). Her argument, which she calls the “Argument from Appearing,” begins with the following premise: “All visual experiences present clusters of properties as being instantiated” (345). The argument proceeds via several plausible steps to the conclusion that “all visual experiences have contents.” Since the Content View is often contested, and since Siegel’s argument appears sound once its first premise is granted, one would expect that Siegel’s opponents would simply deny the first premise. This is not how Siegel sees things. Rather, she argues, anyone who admits that experience involves relations to properties (a view which she attributes to opponents of the Content View such as John Campbell, M.G.F. Martin, and Mark Johnston) is thereby committed to that premise, and so to the Content View. One suspects that these authors will not accede so readily here, perhaps protesting that representational talk has been illicitly smuggled in by the talk of “presents” and “as.” Siegel foresees this objection and notes that “without relying on descriptions like these [‘presents’], the argument could not get off the ground” (354). What follows is a lengthy and subtle discussion of the ways in which the legitimacy of such descriptions could be resisted. No doubt opponents of the Content View will still find somewhere to balk, for it is doubtful that mere reflection on platitudes is sufficient to establish so substantive a thesis as the Content View. Nonetheless, since the premises of Siegel’s argument do appear to be platitudes, Siegel increases the burden on those who deny the Content View by suggesting that they must reject, or at least qualify, certain commonplace remarks about visual experience.

Two other authors, Benj Hellie and M.G.F. Martin, are inclined to defend a negative answer to the foundational question. Whereas Pautz and Siegel’s essays advance arguments in favor of a positive answer, Hellie and Martin approach the question more indirectly, responding to certain challenges to the tenability of a negative answer. Hellie is concerned with the following question: how, within a framework in which perceiving is “understood as a sort of primitively conscious openness to one’s environment” (99), can we capture certain intuitions about “phenomenality,” the sort of intuitions typically reported with the phrase “what it is like”? (Though Hellie articulates doubts (109) about whether invoking this phrase is adequate for capturing phenomenality). Hellie’s central idea is expressed by the following remark: “phenomenality can be thought of as a sort of ‘projection’ by thought of these mysterious features [i.e. the intrinsic features of the world] onto experience.” In a way, Hellie can be thought of as inverting the traditional Humean idea (discussed in Andy Egan’s essay) that the mind “gilds and stains” the world; Hellie’s idea is rather that the world “gilds and stains” the mind. The bulk of the essay is devoted to working out the details of how this idea is to be implemented. These details turn out to involve a substantive amount of apparatus, such as the much-discussed notion of “phenomenal indiscriminability,” which is in turn partly cashed out by the machinery of epistemic two-dimensional semantics. Presumably many readers will have doubts about various parts of this apparatus and so may not accept, or quite understand, Hellie’s account of phenomenality. Nonetheless, Hellie’s discussion, given its subtlety and precision, should provide illumination, even for those for whom it does not quite generate conviction.

Martin’s essay is concerned with the semantics of ‘looks’ sentences. Several authors have argued that the correct account of these sentences requires us to treat visual perception as necessarily involving a relation to content. Martin argues in favor of a “minimalist approach” to the semantics, which he argues is silent on the foundational question. Martin’s main target is the influential account advanced by Frank Jackson in his Perception: A Representative Theory. Martin’s account departs from Jackson’s on at least two crucial points. First, against Jackson, Martin holds that the semantics of the dyadic ‘o looks F’ are to be given prior to the triadic ‘o looks F to S.’ Second, while Martin grants Jackson’s claim that there is a “phenomenal” use of appearance terms such as ‘looks,’ one that characterizes the appearance of an object directly, without any implicit comparison to other objects, he denies that ‘looks’ sentences ascribing colors and shapes to objects typically admit of this phenomenal reading. The phenomenal reading arises, he argues, only when we predicate a property directly of an appearance, rather than of an object. This reading is available, for example, in the sentence “The wine tastes sweet” (182), where ‘sweet’ modifies the taste itself, rather than the wine. But it does not typically arise, Martin argues, in the case of a visual appearance verb such as ‘looks,’ at least not in the case of predicates such as ‘is red’ or ‘is round.’ This is because our usage of such sentences is guided by the fact

that we do not conceive of the visible world as offering us objects of visual awareness and attention distinct from (but coincident with) the concrete objects that we also see … color does not float off … as a distinct object of attention that we think of as produced or associated with the concrete material that we may come to know through the color (187).

There remains room for debate on both Martin’s semantic and his phenomenological claims, but like Hellie’s his essay is a subtle discussion of one of the many issues that bear on the foundational question, as well as a case study in the ways in which semantic considerations do (or do not) settle substantive philosophical questions.

For readers who think the foundational question admits of an easy answer, or that the entire question is badly posed, these four essays may seem in one way or another misguided. But for those of us who think that the question is a significant one, the general impression is a lively sense of its depth and difficulty.

Four other essays turn to the extensional question: what exactly is represented in the contents of visual experience? (This formulation of the question presupposes an affirmative answer to the foundational question. It is an interesting question how the concerns of these authors might be framed were we to give a negative answer to that question). Jonathan Cohen and Fred Dretske both argue that we see slightly less than some philosophers have supposed. Cohen is concerned with a cluster of objections to relational theories of color, such as the dispositional theory, on which colors are “constituted in terms of a relation between subjects and objects” (13). One of these objections is that colors appear to be non-relational. Cohen responds that neither relationality nor non-relationality figures immediately in the contents of experience. The question of whether an appearance property is relational or not is to be tested by comparing experiences with one another and determining how and why they vary. According to this test, Cohen argues, colors do appear relational. Cohen proceeds to defend relational theories against other phenomenological objections. In addition to being a brief in favor of color relationalism, his essay is a thorough review of one attempt at deriving metaphysics from phenomenology.

Dretske’s essay is concerned, among other things, with the question of what we see when we see a collection of objects, such as an array of gray balls. One might have thought that we sometimes see that, collectively, all the balls are gray, in addition to (or instead of) seeing of each ball that it is gray. Dretske denies this, arguing that the collective fact is something that one does not and indeed “could not” see (59). His argument turns on the claim that one cannot determine by vision alone whether (collectively) all the balls are gray because there could be, for example, an orange ball hidden behind one of the gray ones. Speaking of an array of gray balls called ‘A,’ Dretske writes:

Since you could not tell in the brief glance you had of A whether one or more balls are concealed, you cannot tell whether all the balls in A are gray. So you cannot see (and therefore do not know in the collective sense) that all the balls in A are gray (60).

But this sort of claim appears to set a very demanding standard on what one can see: our visual experience arguably often fails to rule out scenarios incompatible with what we take ourselves to see, so a consistent application of Dretske’s criterion threatens to lead to the result that we see very little at all.

Jérôme Dokic’s essay addresses the interesting question of whether particular people enter into the contents of one’s perceptions. Dokic delivers a negative answer to this question and outlines an empirical account of how the recognition of other people works. Mohan Matthen’s essay considers the question of perceptual constancy and inconstancy: whether, for example, a white wall under pink light looks white or pink (or both, or neither), or whether a coin tilted away from the observer looks circular or elliptical (or both, or neither). Matthen delivers a bleak assessment of earlier discussions of this question: “This is an intractable dispute, because each party seems motivated by considerations quite different from the others and seems not even to agree about how to go about settling their differences” (227). Matters turn out not to be quite so dark, however: it is not that the dispute is intractable, but rather that Matthen believes we need further conceptual resources, such as those afforded by ecological approaches to perception, in order to tract it.

There remain the three essays by Andy Egan, Sean Kelly, and Jesse Prinz. Egan’s essay brings contemporary work to bear on articulating a recurrent if elusive theme in modern metaphysics. The theme is “projectivism”: “the thought that some of the features we attribute to things are not ‘really out there’ to be discovered but are instead projected out onto the world by us, or by our perceptual systems” (68). After a thorough discussion of the desiderata that a projectivist account must meet, Egan offers his own positive proposal. The idea, roughly, is that a property calls for projectivist treatment just when the attribution of that property to an object by a speaker has among its correctness conditions an ineliminably de se reference to that speaker. ‘Nearby’ marks such a property: when I say that a certain object is nearby, this is true only if I myself stand at a relatively short distance from that object. The way to capture the projectivist insight with regard to some property (unique hue is his example), Egan argues, is to apply a parallel account to attributions of that property.

Kelly too is attempting to cash out some suggestive but elusive ideas, ones that he finds in Maurice Merleau-Ponty, such as the following remark: "For each object, as for each picture in an art gallery, there is an optimum distance from which it requires to be seen, a direction from which it vouchsafes most of itself" (149). Kelly extends such remarks into claims about the necessary conditions on visual perception. Kelly defends at least two claims. First, perception of the properties of objects is essentially normative, in the sense that (for example) to see an object as square requires that one "must see it to be better seen thus" (152), where “thus” denotes some perspective one could take on the object. Second, perception of the properties of objects is essentially motivational, in the sense that (for example) to see an object as a square requires that one “be motivated to get a better look at it” (155). The latter claim would be especially remarkable if it could be established, but Kelly seems not to fully establish it. For the latter claim is incompatible with the possibility of an observer who sees an object but is utterly indifferent to seeing it any better; but it does seem possible that there be such an observer, and Kelly does fully not explain why he thinks it is not. Kelly is doubtless correct to note, however, that we ourselves are not typically such observers.

Prinz is concerned with something that is largely taken for granted in the foregoing essays, namely the nature of consciousness itself. Prinz’s question is the following: since there are perceptual states that are not conscious (such as blindsight), what is it that makes a perceptual state conscious? His answer is attention: a perceiver’s states are conscious just when she is attending. As Prinz notes, his proposal cuts across the grain of recent work in cognitive neuroscience, where “it has become popular to argue that consciousness and attention are dissociable” (323). Prinz argues, in a lengthy and thoughtful discussion, that the experimental work does not in fact support this dissociation. Whether or not the reader accepts Prinz’s strong link between attention and consciousness, this is a rewarding discussion of their relationship, and especially of the current state of play in empirical investigations into that relationship.

The volume is prefaced with an overview by its editor, Bence Nanay. Nanay emphasizes several themes that he takes to characterize recent work in perception, which he dubs “the new wave” (3). Nanay’s discussion is thoughtful, but the claims to novelty seem somewhat overstated. Nanay is right to suggest that “arguably, the most central question in contemporary philosophy of perception” is “whether, and in what sense, perceptual states could be considered to be representations” (5). This corresponds to what I have called the foundational question, and explicit concern with it does seem to be a distinguishing mark of much recent work on perception. In other respects, however, recent work in perception seems more continuous with past work than Nanay takes it to be. For example, Nanay claims that “an important feature of the new way of arguing about philosophical questions concerning perception is that paying close attention to empirical findings about perception seems to be the norm, rather than the exception” (9). But the best work in perception has long attended to empirical results that bear on it, as well as to a priori considerations. Nor is the a priori absent here: only three of these eleven essays (Dokic, Matthen, Prinz) involve much explicit discussion of empirical work.

Nanay’s largest claim is that “perception is no longer seen as an inferior subfield of philosophy that may or may not help us to understand the philosophical questions that are supposedly more fundamental” (3). But it is not clear that it ever was. Perception has been a predominant concern of modern philosophy, up to and including the analytic period. It is perhaps true that, for a decade or two, the influences of behaviorism and other malevolent intellectual tendencies made perception less central in philosophy than it traditionally had been. But in retrospect this appears to have been an aberration. The normal case is better represented by the essays in this volume. These essays engage with perennial philosophical questions about perception by methods largely a priori, properly disciplined by empirical and phenomenological considerations. In that respect this volume is rather old-fashioned, in a non-pejorative sense of the term.