Perception, Action, and Consciousness: Sensorimotor Dynamics and Two Visual Systems

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Nivedita Gangopadhyay, Michael Madary, and Finn Spicer (eds.), Perception, Action, and Consciousness: Sensorimotor Dynamics and Two Visual Systems, Oxford University Press, 2010, 303pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199551118.

Reviewed by Michael Bruno, Mississippi State University


In July 2007, the University of Bristol hosted an interdisciplinary conference which brought together divergent theoretical perspectives on the relations between perception, action, and consciousness. The conference was organized by Susan Hurley, a tremendously prolific, systematic, and original philosopher, who died later that summer after a long battle with cancer. The papers in this volume largely descend from presentations given at that conference, and Nivedita Gangopadhyay, Michael Madary, and Finn Spicer did a great job putting together a collection of essays befitting Hurley's philosophical legacy. The essays all revolve around recent attempts to better understand the relationship between perceiving and acting. The nature of this relationship is now a central concern in many important debates within the philosophy of mind, perceptual psychology, and cognitive neuroscience, and each essay contributes in some way towards advancing these debates. Taken as a whole, this collection is a good sign of the progress being made by combining theoretical and empirical investigations into the nature of phenomenally conscious visual experience.

The collection includes an editorial introduction, abstracts for each of the essays, and comprehensive indices. The editors organized the contributions into six parts:

(1) Consciousness and sensorimotor dynamics: methodological issues (Dana H. Ballard, J. Kevin O'Regan, and Andy Clark)

(2) The two-visual systems hypothesis (A. David Milner and Melvyn A. Goodale; and Dean R. Melmoth, Marc S. Tibber, and Michael J. Morgan)

(3) Understanding agency and object perception (Mohan Matthen; Pierre Jacob and Frédérique de Vignemont; and Susanna Schellenberg),

(4) Perception and action: studies in cognitive neuroscience (Yves Rossetti, Hisaaki Ota, Annabelle Blangero, Alain Vighetto, and Laure Pisella; Giuseppe Vallar and Flavia Mancini; and Yvonne Delevoye-Turrell, Angela Bartolo, and Yonn Coello),

(5) The role of action and sensorimotor knowledge in sensorimotor theories of perception (Alva Noë and Julian Kiverstein),

(6) Boundaries of the agent (Robert A. Wilson).

The editors classify the contributions as falling under one of two broad families of positions: action-oriented theories and versions of the two visual systems hypothesis. Action-oriented theories consider perception to be a kind of active achievement. These theories include enactive (or sensorimotor or actionist) accounts of visual consciousness, according to which vision requires the active deployment of implicit sensorimotor knowledge, as well as the account of perception defended by Hurley (1998). Enactive theories of perceptual experience are explicitly advocated by O'Regan, Noë, and Kiverstein; Wilson's positive argument for vehicle externalism about visual experience also relies on enactivist commitments. Additionally, action-oriented theories include theories developed in more experimentally driven domains of cognitive neuroscience (e.g., those advanced by Rossetti et al., and by Vallar and Mancini) and philosophical theories of perceptual experience that depart from the standard commitments of enactivism in important ways, yet still maintain that certain types of perception are rightly considered achievements of action (e.g., those of Matthen and Schellenberg). Action-oriented theories differ on whether they regard some visual experiences as partly constituted by dynamical properties of interactions between a body and the surrounding environment. Enactivists accept some version of this claim, but it is less clear that other action-oriented theories do.

The second cluster of positions is united around acceptance of some version of the two visual systems hypothesis. This is the hypothesis that humans have two functionally distinct cortically-based visual systems. One is an unconscious vision-for-action system located in the dorsal stream, which projects from the primary visual cortex to the posterior parietal cortex. The other is a potentially conscious vision-for-perception system located in the ventral stream, which projects from the primary visual cortex to the inferior temporal cortex. Milner and Goodale, and Jacob and de Vignemont develop versions of the two visual systems hypothesis and defend it against recent objections. Ballard, Melmoth et al., Rossetti et al., and Vallar and Mancini raise challenges to it.

One major theme of the volume is that there is tension between these two positions. Action-oriented theories emphasize the ways in which perception depends on action. In contrast, the two visual systems hypothesis postulates a functional distinction between visual perception and visually guided action; if this hypothesis is correct, then perception and action seem to be more independent than action-oriented theories allow. Noë, however, argues that action-oriented theories are not just compatible with evidence supporting the two visual systems hypothesis, but actually are necessary for making sense of it. They provide, he claims, an explanation of how dorsal and ventral streams, which by hypothesis utilize incommensurable encodings of visual information, can communicate. In assessing this tension, two conceptual issues about action-oriented theories should be kept in mind, viz., whether such approaches imply that all forms of visual perception, or just some, are active achievements, and whether they imply that self-generated movement is necessary for seeing, or simply some kind of action-directed thought. While the action-oriented views of Rossetti et al. and Vallar and Mancini maintain movement is necessary, O'Regan, Noë, and Schellenberg explicitly deny that it is.

Another major theme is whether the anatomical distinction between dorsal and ventral pathways corresponds to the functional difference between perception and action. Milner and Goodale, and Jacob and de Vignemont suggest a close correspondence, but others hold that the relation is more complex. It is clear enough that the two pathways do somewhat different things with visual information. Cognitive neuroscientists investigate these functional differences by looking for double dissociations between capacities for perceptual judgment and visuomotor behavior, and the presence or absence of activity in the respective pathways. The method involves locating and isolating different areas of the brain and identifying the cognitive/behavioral functions those areas subserve. Much of the data supporting the two visual systems hypothesis comes from lesion studies on animals, but also from studies with humans who have suffered brain damage which caused lesions in the relevant areas of their brains. Ample functional imaging studies corroborate many of these earlier findings beyond doubt.

The dissociations between dorsal and ventral stream activity can be illustrated by considering people with optic ataxia and visual form agnosia. Optic ataxics have damage to parts of their dorsal streams and are unable to do various visuomotor tasks, yet perform normally on an array of perceptual judgment tasks. Visual form agnosics, on the other hand, have damage to parts of their ventral streams, retain complex visuomotor abilities, and yet are unable to make accurate perceptual judgments. This complementary pattern of abnormalities leads to the inference that the role of the dorsal stream is to process visual information in a way that enables movement, and that the role of the ventral stream is to process visual information in a way that enables perceptual categorization.

Some authors develop alternative functional characterizations of the streams. Jacob and de Vignemont, for instance, distinguish ventrally-based semantic processing, which enables an agent to elaborate beliefs about the surroundings, from dorsally-based pragmatic processing, which promotes fulfillment of an agent's intentions by guiding real-time actions. Moreover, they claim that what accounts for these functional differences is that the dorsal stream encodes spatial properties in egocentric coordinates, where things are located from the position of perceiver, while the ventral stream encodes spatial properties in allocentric coordinates, where things are located relative to other things in the visual field. Finally, by disentangling issues surrounding the coding of spatial information and the alleged independence of consciousness from dorsal stream activity, Jacob and de Vignemont's version of the two visual systems hypothesis allows that kinds of egocentric spatial phenomenology may be partly grounded in the dorsal stream.

Similarly, Matthen distinguishes descriptive and motion-guiding functions of vision. He argues that since the latter primarily involve the control of limbs during voluntary and involuntary action, information is not retained and used to keep track of stable features of the external environment, as it is with descriptive vision. Motion-guiding vision represents objects in an egocentric frame of reference and contributes to an agent's awareness of its surroundings by furnishing a special kind of indexical or demonstrative consciousness of objects present in the immediate environment. The descriptive functions of vision, for Matthen, involve the production of representations that are "storable and recallable; [that] influence future behaviour via memory functions such as conditioning, habituation, sensitization, and priming" and are typically "at least potentially conscious" (119). Descriptive vision locates things in allocentric frames of reference, and descriptive contents, lacking perceptual presence, are what actual cases of conscious seeing have in common with pictorial vision, mental imagery, dreams, and episodic memory.

Nevertheless, these functional characterizations may oversimplify matters. After all, there are numerous connections between dorsal and ventral pathways at all points, as well as back projections to the visual cortex and to subcortical regions that form part of a separate oculomotor system. The streams eventually re-converge in the frontal eye fields. These anatomical facts, along with considerations about the timescale required for perceptual experience, may tell against the two visual system hypothesis' localization of coarse-grained visual functions to relatively confined parts of the brain. As Ballard argues "any attempt to put consciousness in a neural 'place' is unlikely to succeed" because "any two cortical areas are intimately part of any computation that they are both involved in" (23). If Ballard is right, then any characterization of ventral stream activity as itself, in isolation, potentially conscious and suited for perception is unlikely to be correct. Moreover, some have suggested that the interconnections between streams better warrants a tripartite rather than binary functional division between cortical visual systems.

One complication for the two visual systems hypothesis involves cases of unilateral spatial neglect, in which a lesion on one side of the brain leads to partial blindness in the visual field opposite to the lesion, even though visual information about the neglected area is processed implicitly. Vallar and Mancini provide a comprehensive overview of the available evidence relating to unilateral spatial neglect and argue that these data fail to map onto the distinction between a dorsal vision-for-action and a ventral vision-for-perception system. Specifically, they argue that the patterns of preserved versus impaired characteristics are quite different from those for visual form agnosia and that this can only be explained if parts of the dorsal stream play a constitutive role in grounding certain kinds of spatial visual experience. Additionally, Delevoye-Turrell et al. show that judgments about what is within reach, or within peripersonal space, are affected by changing the predicted outcome of behavior of some visuomotor task and by application of transcranial magnetic stimulation to motor processing areas of the brain. They also report data that schizophrenia involves some impairment in using motor representations to determine the boundaries of peripersonal space. This likewise suggests that action-oriented processing is necessary for some kinds of spatial visual experiences.

Likewise, neither optic ataxia nor visual form agnosia are so straightforward. Many ataxics live and visually navigate the world for years before learning of their condition, despite dorsal stream damage. This alone gives some reason to doubt that ventral stream's functioning is limited to perceptual categorization. By reassessing a large body of the available evidence about optic ataxia, Rossetti et al. argue that the two visual systems hypothesis is untenable. They further suggest that optic ataxia is primarily a condition that affects peripheral vision. Milner and Goodale respond by pointing out that optic ataxics demonstrate some abnormalities when reaching towards objects in both central and peripheral parts of their visual fields. The evidence on visual form agnosia also raises complications. Studies on the agnosic DF have shown that engaging in visuomotor tasks while also making perceptual form discrimination judgments improves her ability to make accurate judgments. This seems to directly implicate dorsal stream activity in DF's (limited) ability to perceptually discriminate shapes. Jacob and de Vignemont, and Milner and Goodale consider refinements to their models in light of these complications.

The two visual systems hypothesis is also supported by dissociations between perceptual judgments and behavioral tasks involving visual illusions, but here too there are complications. Many psychophysical studies show that some fine-grained movements are impervious to visual illusions. For instance, one influential study found that even when people judge the size of the two inner circles in the Ebbinghaus/Titchner illusion to be different, they adjust their grip aperture to the inner circles' actual size when asked to reach for them. However, Melmoth et al. argue against the two visual streams hypothesis because perceptual and motor pointing tasks were affected similarly in their study using the Poggendorff illusion. They claim the data they report instead support the conjecture that a single unified representation of spatial position is used for both perceptual and motor tasks. Furthermore, based on studies with the optic ataxic IG involving motor tasks when presented with visual illusions, Rossetti et al. conclude that the dorsal stream does not always play a role in the online visual guidance of bodily movement.

Another central theme of the volume is the relation between having a conscious experience and being able to report having had that experience. Discussing visual form agnosia, Clark considers whether the available evidence is sufficient to rule out there being visual consciousness which fails to be conceptually integrated for reports. While experience seems to guide action, the two visual systems hypothesis suggests that visual experience merely helps select targets to act upon, but does not aid in the actual control of executed movements. What a person experiences on any given occasion, however, may outstrip what that person can report having experienced, and so it cannot be ruled out that the states enabling agnosics to perform successful visuomotor tasks are actually conscious. After all, any report must route through motor systems, and one can speculate about whether phenomenal consciousness can be present in states independent of motor system involvement. Sorting out the relations between phenomenal consciousness, reportability, and other forms of rational accessibility is tricky. However, Jacob and de Vignemont argue that since the agnosic DF is unable to bind length and width or store such binding information iconically in memory, she is likely unaware of the objects' shapes presented to her. This additional evidence supports the contention that she does not consciously perceive shape properties that require such binding.

More ambitiously, O'Regan argues that enactive accounts of phenomenal consciousness can explain the ineffability and structure of visual experience along with what it is like for a person to have such experiences. He also argues that neither finding neural correlates of different conscious experiences, nor discovering isomorphisms between brain activity and the similarity or difference judgments people make amongst their conscious states, provides a sufficient explanation of the structure of conscious experience. Rather, the laws that describe the sensorimotor interactions enabled by brain mechanisms constitute the character of experience. Similarly, Noë defends the idea that a distinct kind of practical sensorimotor understanding is always exercised in perceptual experience. Schellenberg argues that the capacities to represent one's own location and to know how objects will look from the different perspectives one could gain through action provide jointly necessary conditions for the ability to perceive objects' intrinsic spatial properties. Kiverstein argues that subpersonal sensorimotor expectations contribute essentially to visual experiences of unattended background detail and the intrinsic properties of visually encountered objects.

Focusing on the dependence of visual experience on the surrounding environment, Wilson argues that visual experience sometimes extends beyond one's body by considering the most important functions of vision and how systems fulfilling those functions manage to do so. Wilson focuses on the sensory systems of other animals, particularly bats and electric fish, to pump the reader's intuition that some forms of perceptual experience may extend beyond organismic boundaries. Then, by considering the intricate and ancient role human vision plays in guiding successful action, he argues that a similar extension thesis about many kinds of pedestrian visual experiences is plausible.

I wonder what Wilson would say in response to Clark's (2009) objection to extended vision. Clark argues that phenomenal consciousness is likely supported by complex dynamical properties of coupled neural activity, the kind of activity that requires high bandwidth information flow. Sense organs such as the eyes, however, always act as low bandwidth information filters, and so anything in the environment is effectively screened off from counting as part of the constitutive base of visual experience. If highly abstract properties of neural activity, such as synchrony, are what are necessary and sufficient for phenomenal consciousness, then any coupling between the brain, body, and environment cannot be of the relevant sort to ground visual experience. One thing Wilson could say is that some of what human vision is functionally tuned to, and hence some of what we consciously see, takes place at a relatively slow time scale. When we have sufficiently phenomenally rich visual experiences, for instance, our brains may have a large enough window of time to be significantly entrained by the quick motion of the eyes and nearly instantaneous speed of the light traversing the optical environment. That entrainment may constitutively implicate the surrounding environment as part of the grounds of those visual experiences. But this is very speculative and would have to be developed into an actual empirical hypothesis, and then confirmed, to really help Wilson's case.

It is an exciting and confusing time to be thinking about consciousness and to be trying to figure out some large, still outstanding issues related to it. Perception, Action, and Consciousness does not resolve the tension between action-oriented theories of perception and the two visual systems hypothesis, as should be expected, or really any other of the major themes the volume tackles; nevertheless, the curious reader's thinking about perception and action will be greatly enriched by reading it carefully. My only reservation about the volume is that I wish more than few of the essays had addressed Hurley's particular views on the relation between perception and action. Hurley's work on a wide range of philosophical topics was detailed and insightful, and often what she said about one topic was connected with her views on a number of other topics. In the introduction to the volume, the editors illustrate some of this connectedness by quoting a passage from Hurley (1998) in which she explained how her views on the unity of consciousness motivate the claim that there are significant interdependencies between perception and action. Moreover, Hurley's (1998) rejection of a 'classical sandwich' conception of cognition led to her development of an unorthodox simulation-based theory of mind (Hurley 2008) and a defense of vehicle externalism about conscious vision (Hurley 2010). The closing contributions by Kiverstein and Wilson, each of which explore themes from Hurley's work in some depth, are for this reason particularly helpful.


I would like to thank Marica Bernstein, John Bickle, David Chalmers, and Shaun Nichols for help with this review.


Clark, A. (2009). Spreading the joy? Why the machinery of consciousness is (probably) still in the head. Mind 118, 472, 963-93.

Hurley, S.L. (1998). Consciousness in action, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Hurley, S.L. (2008). The shared-circuits model: how control, mirroring, and simulation can enable imitation and mind-reading. Behavioral and Brain Sciences 31, 1, 1-22.

Hurley, S.L. (2010). Varieties of externalism. In R. Menary (ed.), The Extended Mind. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 101-54.