Perception and its Development in Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology

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Kirsten Jacobson and John Russon (eds.), Perception and its Development in Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology, University of Toronto Press, 2017, 373pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781487501280.

Reviewed by Dimitris Apostolopoulos, University of Notre Dame


In the words of its editors, this volume aims to “illuminate, defend, and expand on the insights developed in Merleau-Ponty’s Phenomenology of Perception” (‘A Note on Citations’). It has four parts: ‘Passivity and Intersubjectivity’ (I); ‘Generality and Objectivity’ (II); ‘Meaning and Ambiguity’ (III); and ‘Expression’ (IV). To give a sense of the range of topics covered, and their philosophical and textual scope, I will review contributions from each of its parts, before making some broader observations.

The volume opens with a contribution from John Russon on the relations among attention, freedom, and passivity (themes that the ‘Introduction’ claimed were intimately connected, in the guise of “openness” and “creativity”). Having considered examples suggesting that attending is a context-dependent practice that responds to objects, rather than a free-floating or independent power of the will, Russon claims that it is also a commitment which takes up givens that (following Sartre) could have been otherwise (26-28). This open structure is made possible by the fact that situations “afford” possibilities for focusing our attention, which are given by intentional objects. For example, when we see a calendar, this inevitably elicits thoughts about upcoming tasks or deadlines, which show up as an “imperative.” Gradually, subjects develop an ability to engage with objects (and with responses of this sort) through habituation, which testifies to the developmental possibilities of perceptual capacities (31).

Where, then, does freedom fit in this picture? For Russon, freedom “is just determinacy” (32). That is, constraints (like those of the calendar-imperative) circumscribe definite modes of behavior that can be transformed and redefined (the examples of work and communication are invoked in support of this claim). Communication is especially relevant because the constraints imposed by the world may be modified by others (35). Russon concludes that freedom is ultimately more akin to a “question,” and requires “answerability to others” (37).

Kym Maclaren argues that emotions are “institutions.” After explicating the concept of ‘institution’ (a topic considered in lectures from the mid-1950s), she maintains that it can already be found in the Phenomenology. In that text, Merleau-Ponty is already opposed to ‘constitution’: expression and perception require a different mode of meaning-formation, which is less the work of an autonomous agent, and more akin to embodied transformation of possibilities. Even if the explicit contrast with constitution is made in later lectures, the account of meaning formation in the Phenomenology can be “retrospectively” identified as a version of institution (53; 55). This helps to sharpen some important contrasts between the two concepts. But even if one takes heed of the relevant differences that Maclaren nicely outlines (56-58), one might still wonder if ‘institution’ could also be seen as a development of some features of constitution that Merleau-Ponty seeks to retain (especially given his non-negligible positive references to it in some later writings). With a look at the emotion of love, the rest of the essay nicely illustrates what this difference could mean in practice (62-63). Loving another allows us to realize a “new way of seeing the world,” which institutes a new dimension of experience. But this unfolds only if we do not impose our own image or construal onto the beloved (qua constitutive agent). Emotions like love rely on a ‘between’ structure, an observation that helpfully clarifies the concept of institution (65).

Part II opens with an essay by Kirsten Jacobson on the phenomenon of ‘spatial neglect,’ in which subjects are unaware of or miss an object (or event) on one side of their body. According to Jacobson, our ability to neglect spaces is possible thanks to the body’s capacity to produce space (101). The body is “virtual,” in that it can adapt to a range of situations, and finds a home whenever it can coordinate with its environment (103). She entertains and rejects two putative explanations of spatial neglect: a neurological view, on which damage to the right lobe accounts for discrepancies in action; and a psychological or rationalistic view, which puts an emphasis on subjects’ need to repress their lost abilities. The first fails to account for cases in which patients can notice objects on their left side (despite physiological damage), and for cases of damage to the left lobe, e.g. among stroke victims who experience spatial neglect in right hemisphere (106). The second ignores how the body adapts to disturbances by shaping a new mode of existence, and neglects the complexity of the phenomenon in question.

Jacobson’s solution takes direction from Merleau-Ponty’s account of motor-disorders (e.g. the phantom limb or the Schneider case), and creatively develops his insights. Studies show that spatial-neglect patients experience space somewhat like Schneider (109). Accordingly, we may conclude that they no longer live out a world that is “actualizable” for them (111). Such cases are better understood in terms of subjects’ modifications of prior embodied capacities, which open or impede possible movements in space (114). Jacobson ends with the constructive suggestion that clinical treatments for these subjects ought to focus on how they might acquire and develop new embodied capacities (116).

David Ciavatta argues that Merleau-Ponty’s account of temporality provides an “indirect phenomenology of natural time” (162). Ciavatta observes that cycles like day and night, or inhaling and exhaling, “constitute the general horizons that contextualize and thus inform all of our experience in advance of our having this or that particular experience,” without, however, becoming an object of experience (161). We are indifferent to this kind of ‘generalized’ time, and treat it as a recurring cycle. For Ciavatta, subjectivity is supported by structures that are “derived from” the cyclicality of natural time.

After describing in more detail the impersonal repetitions or rhythms that we are largely indifferent to (168-169), Ciavatta notes that our experience of temporal continuity unfolds thanks to a differentiation of these experiences from more discontinuous, episodic, or passing moments (171). Here again, we are largely indifferent to events of this sort, even if we cannot but acknowledge some degree of individuation. As he reads Merleau-Ponty, subjects must also be able to identify layers of temporality that are “indifferent to all inaugural events that ground historical narratives through which I typically make sense of world” (176). In other words, we may recognize a distinctively natural time of cyclical repetitions.

This piece helpfully clarifies the relation between natural and human time. It suggests that despite his subject-centric focus, Merleau-Ponty may still be committed to a view of natural time, the structure of which is nevertheless quite proximate to that of subjective temporal experience. Even if “Merleau-Ponty works towards the idea that the natural world as a whole is itself historical,” Ciavatta notes that he also claims that there is a past that was ‘never present,’ or a “past of all pasts” that we cannot access. Together with “time’s historical a priori,” this makes up “time’s natural a priori” (177). These considerations complicate a straightforward identify between human and natural time, and offer an opportunity to rethink this relation. But, given some of Merleau-Ponty’s remarks (e.g. PhP 413-414/453-454; 87/114), one might worry that the “past of all pasts” is still personal, rather than natural or akin to a phenomenal form of the world, and recalcitrant to grounding in (or explanation in terms of) nature.

In the first essay of Part III, David Morris explores the temporal character of meaning. For Morris, “meaning is not so much in time as made ‘of’ temporality — meaning is temporality” (194). To show this, instead of focusing on the latter sections of the Phenomenology (which establish an identity between subjectivity, sense, and time), Morris appeals to ‘institution.’ He first argues for a (seemingly general) view of meaning on which meanings depend on differences, and get their content from them (e.g. ‘love is not hate’). These differences contain more than what might at first seem to be given in them (197). This view is unpacked in the remainder of the paper.

Morris claims that Merleau-Ponty’s understanding of meaning can be clarified by the concept of a ‘level’: sense-making requires that we situate entities in terms of others, according to a norm, guide, or level (perhaps akin to a Gestalt) (198-199). Levels or norms are not descriptive, but “transcendental” requirements. The role of temporality comes out in Morris’s example of balancing: only by diverging (moving back and forth) from points in space, a process unfolding over time, can we find the norm that allow us to balance ourselves. A similar logic can be found in Merleau-Ponty’s remarks on expression: new expressive possibilities emerge thanks to differentiations from existing conventions (203-204).

Morris turns to institution to clarify how sense can have direction while transforming given meanings. Merleau-Ponty’s remarks on maturation and puberty from the Institution lectures show that sexual maturity emerges through a ‘gradual operation,’ which allows current behavior to appear as decidedly sexual, rather than merely “playful,” a possibility that did not exist before (209). Morris then returns to Structure, and argues that the concept of ‘structure’ anticipates that of ‘institution’ and ‘level.’ The account offered here “undoes” divisions between a priori and a posteriori, a result evidenced by Structure‘s account of the soul-body relation (210). Despite Merleau-Ponty’s claim that this relation can be accounted for by constitution, Morris asserts that by this he really means ‘institution’, for Merleau-Ponty’s view of temporality presupposes a non-constitutive account. In Structure, temporality is not just a subjective condition, but also an ontological one, i.e. it is part of the physical order: the “flow of events generate something new by carrying past over present towards future” (212). This piece draws important connections between structure and institution, and clarifies how the latter might flow from the former.

In a subtle essay, Scott Marratto responds to Levinas’s challenge that (1) Merleau-Ponty reduces otherness to a function of knowledge or consciousness (his visual focus might suggest as much); and (2) he defines expression as an “incestuous disturbance,” instead of a genuine address to the other. For Marratto, Merleau-Ponty’s “mature” account of artistic expression can adequately respond to these points (243). In a discussion of painting, Marratto concedes that Merleau-Ponty emphasizes the importance of vision (as Levinas claims). But this is not an endorsement of Western “ocularcentrism” (244). For Merleau-Ponty, vision is on a continuum with other behaviors, and is a mixture of active and passive elements. Vision admits of a depth and distance that does not rule out a deeper proximity or complicity with objects and subjects (245).

To respond to Levinas’s first point, Marratto turns to aesthetic traditions. For Merleau-Ponty, the call to make something new should be seen as an ethical demand of responsibility to alterity (in this case, to a painter or painters), “by a kind of kenosis in favour of the otherness that the painter already encounters within herself” (246). That we depend on traditions means that otherness is already in us, and becomes a condition for “openness” to the world. But this also reveals something about perception. Textual evidence shows that vision is no “modality of knowledge”: perception opens onto conditions (others, objects, the tradition, etc.) that question the subject’s self-sufficiency (247). There can be no fusion of self with other in perceptual experience, because relations like reversibility (which characterize it) are incomplete by necessity. For Merleau-Ponty, there can be difference between self and other without need for identification (248). Marratto meets Levinas’s second challenge by first noting that for Merleau-Ponty, artworks create unfamiliar worlds. A work is incomplete, and calls for an audience to complete it. But this audience is not “already extant.” Paintings create an expressive dialogue in which subjects do not “shut themselves up” but genuinely live with one another, which allows for a non-reductive relation to others (250).

In the final part (IV), Stefan Kristensen suggests that performance artist Ana Mendieta’s work can help us better understand Merleau-Ponty’s view of phenomenal space. After considering remarks about spatiality in Merleau-Ponty’s later work, he concludes that there are two notions of space at work here: one rests on a distinction between consciousness and world; and another, more fundamental view holds that space is depth (or what he calls “phenomenal space”). On the latter, space and time are indiscernible and unified through movement (272-273).

Mendieta’s work (known as ‘Earth Body Art’) can help us understand the latter, which is Kristensen’s focus. She creates embodied figures that convey a sense of “immemorial space,” which serves as an “object of mourning and as power of creation” (275). The sense of mourning in question pertains to the experience of attempting to retrieve the subject of perception: our body remains in the background, but when we realize what we are doing (e.g. while seeing a particular object), the perceptual subject vanishes. For Kristensen, we are in danger of losing the subject of perception: the body is “constantly mourning itself,” and reflections on Mendieta’s work serve to clarify this experience (277).

Peter Costello explores political themes — in particular, how Merleau-Ponty’s work can inform democratic citizenship. After describing the later concept of ‘flesh’, which Costello claims supports experiences of anonymity and visibility (286), he then interprets it in a collective vein. Flesh imposes a requirement of political “stewardship” (288). The latter entails that we must attend to and are responsible for one another. After developing an extended analogy between painting and politics (both allow us to see the world in a certain way; 290, 292), Costello turns to Cézanne. Like a “good democrat,” Cézanne puts his body in the service of others, in response to a tradition, and “with those who are its citizens” (294). Costello suggest that democracy would be more successful if, like painting, it embodied ‘silent’ modes of expression more frequently, which would increase the likelihood that citizens become open to one another (299-300).

This volume covers important themes in Merleau-Ponty’s work, and one can learn a lot by reading it (the limits of this review do not allow for a consideration of the insights contained in other essays). For example, the guiding theme of perceptual development (understood as the development of a subject’s perceptual capacities) is nicely elucidated. A number of essays also clarify the stakes of key concerns in Merleau-Ponty’s work, including his reflections on expression, institution, space, temporality, philosophical reflection, and art.

One may wonder, however, to what extent this collection meets its goal of serving as a “companion” volume that “runs roughly parallel” to Phenomenology of Perception (18). As their titles suggest, Parts I-IV do not track the text’s structure (e.g., in this volume, treatments of freedom and time can be found in its first two parts, whereas they are located in the latter sections of the Phenomenology). What is more, many contributions discuss themes that do not arise in the Phenomenology, and some essays focus on later writings, or on figures that Merleau-Ponty did not engage with. A reader looking for close textual commentary on the Phenomenology might therefore be left wanting. The editors note that the volume’s contributions are “oriented less toward commentaries on [Merleau-Ponty’s] texts than towards descriptions and analyses of the phenomena themselves” (8). While this is an admirable goal, the book’s title suggests a slightly different focus (to their credit, some contributors explicitly flag sections of their papers that are not offered in the spirit of direct commentary). In light of the insights the volume contains, however, these considerations are minor: this collection will be of benefit to students of phenomenology and of Merleau-Ponty alike.