Perception and its Modalities

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Dustin Stokes, Mohan Matthen and Stephen Biggs (eds.), Perception and its Modalities, Oxford University Press, 2015, 494pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199832811.

Reviewed by Louise Richardson, University of York


The philosophy of perception has in recent years taken a turn away from an almost exclusive focus on sight and also, to some extent, from consideration of the traditional theories of perception. The nineteen new essays in this greatly varied volume reflect -- and in one case reflect upon -- this turn. In 'The Dominance of the Visual' Dustin Stokes and Stephen Biggs seek to explain vision's specialness and thus the 'visuocentrism' of the study of perception. They argue that vision dominates the other senses in a number of ways and that this dominance is epistemically significant and good: vision dominates the other senses just in so far as it is epistemically advantageous for it do to so. Nevertheless they agree with the other contributors to the volume that 'traditional theorizing about the senses is hampered by a neglect of the senses other than vision' (p. 1). Whilst vision is not neglected in the volume (it gets its own section), perception that is either non-visual or not exclusively visual dominates here. Unusually, the theories of perception -- representationalism, sense-data theory, naïve realism, for example -- are barely mentioned.

Unlike Fiona Macpherson's The Senses: Classic and Contemporary Perspectives, the theme of this anthology is not the nature and individuation of the senses, though two essays address this issue explicitly: Fiona Macpherson's 'The Space of Sensory Modalities' and Roberto Casati, Jérôme Dokic and François Le Corre's 'Distinguishing the Commonsense Senses'. H. P. Grice's criteria for distinguishing between the senses are also called upon in Ophelia Deroy and Malika Auvray's 'A Crossmodal Perspective on Sensory Substitution'. Deroy and Auvray argue, very plausibly, that the use of Sensory Substitution Devices 'leads to some novel ability, which does not, however, constitute a new sense properly speaking but a form of artificial crossmodal rewiring resting on pre-existing sensory capacities'. (p. 331) Though the ongoing debate about the nature of the senses is not central to the book, Macpherson's essay is an important contribution to that debate. She responds to Richard Gray's criticism (Gray 2012) of her suggestion (Macpherson 2011) that we can construct a space of sensory modalities within which we could plot the senses of humans, animals and even fictional creatures. The clustering of senses within the space might yield further information about them: information that we did not put in to the space in constructing it. In her contribution Macpherson argues, in response to Gray, that it is possible in principle to construct such a space. Furthermore, though the space we thus construct will be difficult to visualize, since it will have very many dimensions, we will be able to extract further information from the space by using Principle Component Analysis ('a mathematical procedure that is used to analyse high dimensional space in which data are plotted' (p. 455)).

The contributions to the volume are collected under six headings -- New Models of Perception; Multimodal Perception; The Nonvisual Senses; Sensing Ourselves; New Issues Concerning Vision; and Relating the Modalities -- and are, according to the anthology's introduction, united in their recognition of the 'shortcomings of tradition'. This is most obvious in, for instance, Andy Clark's 'Perceiving as Predicting', which introduces and summarises some evidence for the still-novel predictive coding model of perceptual processing, and in Nicholas Shea's 'Distinguishing Top-Down from Bottom-Up Effects', which -- though it begins with a discussion of how we should distinguish top-down effects from mere use of information stored in modules -- argues that there is no theoretically useful distinction between perception and cognition. Some challenges to tradition are less obvious. For instance Clare Batty considers the possibility that the 'object recognition model' of olfactory processing defended by Donald Wilson and Richard Stevenson (2006, 2007) 'makes available a view according to which object perception can involve something akin to object recognition without object individuation' (p. 223). If this view is correct, then the visual perception of objects is not a good model for the perception of objects more generally. The visual perception of objects involves, or is thought to involve, two stages. The first stage is that of object individuation, in which perceptual features such as colour and shape are grouped into representations of individuals. The second stage is that of object recognition, which 'draws on object individuation in achieving further object involving tasks' (p. 230). If it is traditional to take the visual perception of objects as a model for the perception of objects more generally, then Batty's essay can be seen as (at least) entertaining the possibility of a break with this tradition.

It may, however, be somewhat artificial to see the essays that make up this volume as unified by any common purpose, even one as encompassing as challenging tradition. And the strength of this anthology lies in any case in its diversity. Two of my favourite contributions are particularly difficult to categorise: Mohan Matthen's 'Active Perception and the Representation of Space' adds a historical dimension to the book. Matthen defends Kant's claim that space is an a priori intuition, where that is understood to mean that it is pre-modal, i.e., not specific to any sense and also not derived from the senses. In 'Inner Sense' Vincent Picciuto and Peter Carruthers consider whether introspection deserves to be thought a sense. Rather than defend an answer to this question they take the appropriately cautious approach of identifying features of prototypical senses and considering whether the mechanisms of introspection, on three different accounts of those mechanisms, have these features.

It is partly the diversity of this anthology that will make it a very useful read for someone looking for a topic on which to write a PhD thesis in the philosophy of perception. But it will also be useful for such a reader because Perception and its Modalities makes clear how much work there is left to do in this area of philosophy, not least on those topics about which its contributors do not agree. Take, for example, some of those essays that consider multimodal perception. That perception is multimodal is often cited as a reason for taking visuocentrism to be pernicious. It is widely accepted (see, for instance, Casey O'Callaghan's 'Not All Perceptual Experience is Modality Specific', p. 133) that perception is multimodal at least in the minimal sense that one is usually perceiving in more than one modality at a time -- seeing the flowers whilst smelling their odour and hearing the buzz of the bees, for instance. However, Charles Spence and Tim Bayne argue in 'Is Consciousness Multisensory?' that there is no convincing evidence for the claim that we ever have experiences in different modalities, simultaneously. All apparent evidence for this claim, they suggest, is consistent with the hypothesis that there is instead rapid switching between experiences in different modalities.

Matthew Fulkerson defends the claim that touch is a single sense, in that separate channels of information associated with perceiving tactually 'hang together in a special way' in which channels associated with perceiving in different senses -- sight and hearing, for example -- do not hang together (p. 191, see also Fulkerson 2013). What is present in the case of touch and absent in the case of sight and hearing is, according to Fulkerson, the co-assignment to external objects of features represented by the different channels, by sensory binding. But if Matthew Nudds is right in his contribution 'Is Audio-Visual Perception "Amodal" or "Crossmodal'?' there is reason to believe that channels associated with sight and hearing are related as Fulkerson argues that channels associated with touch are related:

the perceptual system represents objects amodally: a number of initially distinct processing streams combine to produce a single amodal representation of an object that represents it as having features -- such as spatial and temporal features -- that may have been perceived with more than one sense modality, as well as features -- such as colour -- that are modality specific. A single amodal object representation may represent an object as shaped, coloured, and as the source of a sound. (p. 173)

If Nudds is right then one might, for example, (a) look for some other way to explain the unity of touch, (b) conclude that since the components of what we usually think of as touch hang together no more than sight and hearing, touch is not a unified sense, or (c) conclude that since sight and touch hang together much as the components of touch do, we should think of them as components of a single sense. Determining the correct response will require both empirical and more straightforwardly philosophical work. Nudds points out that we can 'test the claim that there are amodal object representations' in a way that is analogous to the way in which scientists have tested the claim that 'visual information about different features is grouped into an object file' (p. 183). Evidence for the existence of object files comes from the 'object specific preview benefit' (p. 170). This is the name given to the fact that subjects are better at naming a letter displayed on the same object, before and after it has moved location, than they are at naming, for example, the same letter displayed before and after an interval of time on different objects. If there are amodal object representations -- or amodal object files -- 'we would expect there to be crossmodal object-specific preview benefits' (p. 183). Nudds found one experiment the results of which are 'difficult to explain' on the assumption that object representations are modality specific. However, he notes that more evidence (by which he means empirical evidence) is needed to support his suggestion that there are amodal representations of objects. (pp. 185-86)

What more straightforwardly philosophical work might we need to do in order to determine the correct response to the disagreement between Nudds and Fulkerson? One task is to work out what role, if any, unity (or disunity) in the processing or mechanisms that enable perception should have in deciding questions about the unity or disunity of our capacity to perceive, tactually, or any other perceptual capacity. For example, the following question will need to be answered: might it not be the case that perception in a single (unified) modality is enabled by diverse mechanisms and processes, and perhaps by mechanisms and processes that also enable perception in another modality?


Fulkerson, M. (2013). The First Sense. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Gray, R. (2013). Is There a Space of Sensory Modalities? Erkenntnis. 78 (6), 1259-1273.

Macpherson, F. (2011). Taxonomising the Senses. Philosophical Studies. 153 (1), 123-142.

Wilson, D. A. and Stevenson, R. J. (2006). Learning to Smell: Olfactory Perception from Neurobiology to Behaviour. Baltimore: John Hopkins University Press.

Wilson, D. A. and Stevenson, R. J. (2007). Odour Perception: an Object Recognition Approach. Perception 36: 1821-1833.