Perception and Knowledge: A Phenomenological Account

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Walter Hopp, Perception and Knowledge: A Phenomenological Account, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 246pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107003163.

Reviewed by Mark Okrent, Bates College


In his philosophically rich and tightly argued book Perception and Knowledge, Walter Hopp offers an account of the nature of perception, and the evidential relation between perception and knowledge, that beautifully exemplifies the recent tendency to appeal to the phenomenology of perceptual states in order to help resolve thorny problems that have arisen in contemporary debates concerning epistemology and the metaphysics of mind. Hopp's description of the phenomenology of perception is distinctive, however, in that he explicitly appeals to the phenomenological investigations of Edmund Husserl, without in any way treating those investigations as an authoritative or legitimizing source. In this respect Perception and Knowledge is also a very valuable addition to the growing literature that refuses to recognize any substantive gap between the 'analytic' and 'continental' traditions.

The overall thesis of Perception and Knowledge is complex, involving at least three parts. Hopp holds (1) that perceptual experiences have intentional content, (2) that this perceptual content is non-conceptual, and (3) that perceptual experiences provide evidential rational support for beliefs through 'fulfilling' the content of beliefs, rather than by directly or indirectly supporting premises from which those beliefs can be inferred. (Hopp's consideration of the third sub-thesis, while elegant and suggestive, presupposes the truth of sub-theses (1) and (2). And, since there are important issues surrounding his argument for (2), in light of space limitations I will focus my discussion on the first two sub-theses.) Hopp recognizes the relative independence of the first two theses, and his argumentative strategy is to embed his positive arguments for these positions within a dialogue in which he criticizes the arguments of an opposing group of contemporaries who disagree with him on the issue at hand. In regard to (1), the target opponents are those, such as John Campbell and M. G. F. Martin, who hold relational views of perception, and Hopp devotes the entirety of his lengthy Chapter 6 to the criticism of their attempts to dispense with perceptual content. The target opponents regarding thesis (2) are those, such as John McDowell, who hold that all content is conceptual, and much of the first five chapters of the book are devoted to a rebuttal of their arguments, together with the development of Hopp's positive views concerning the non-conceptual character of perceptual experiences.

Hopp attacks the relational view of perception and with it the doctrine that perceptions lack intentional contents, on the rather traditional grounds that it doesn't have the resources to cope with hallucinations. Since relational views of perception hold that the actual objects of perception partially constitute one's perceptual experience, all versions of the relational view are committed to some form of disjunctivism, the doctrine that rejects the claim that the very same kind of event occurs when one perceives an object having such and such a property as when one hallucinates what appears to be that object having that property. But, Hopp argues, this implies that relational views cannot supply a satisfactory account of why it is that hallucinations are errors. If hallucinations are partially constituted by some deviant, non-actual objects, then they are not errors about any actual objects, but veridical concerning those weird objects. If hallucinations are characterized negatively by being indistinguishable subjectively from their corresponding perceptions, then they are about or of nothing, and thus cannot be errors about anything. Of course a relationalist could, and would, reply that hallucinations are not intrinsically errors, but rather that they have some sort of relationship, causal or subjectively justificatory, with beliefs that are false. Hopp responds to this move with a battery of arguments against specific versions of this position, arguments that, to my mind, vary in regard to their effectiveness.

Hopp embeds this negative argument against relational views of perception in a larger argumentative context that has a surprising twist, as the conclusion of that larger argument is that a modified version of disjunctivism is true. And, it is important to note, this argument further involves the anti-Husserlian view that we don't have introspective access to all aspects of the content of our intentional states. Roughly, Hopp argues that 'pure internalism', the conjunction of the thesis that content determines reference, the thesis that two experiences have the same content just in case they have the same phenomenological character, and the thesis that two experiences have the same phenomenological character if and only if they are indistinguishable from one another through introspection alone, is incapable of handling either familiar twin earth cases or cases in which the perceptual experiences of two numerically distinct objects are qualitatively subjectively indistinguishable. His argument against relationalism commits him to the first thesis. But, since the problem cases show that there are situations in which it is impossible to introspectively distinguish perceptual states that are about different objects, he concludes that there must be an aspect of the content of a perceptual state, the aspect that picks out its singular object, to which we lack introspective access. And this, in turn, implies a weak form of disjunctivism. Actual perceptions of an object X are different kinds of acts from acts that are not really perceptions of X (either because they are hallucinations or because they are veridical perceptions of some object other than X), in that they have different contents; the first but not the second have a content that picks out the numerically distinct object X itself, but are indistinguishable introspectively by the agent.

While Hopp spends considerable space engaging with, and rejecting, the relational view of perception, it is not really his primary focus. Rather, the first five chapters of Perception and Knowledge focus on the issue of whether or not the contents of perceptual acts are conceptual. To be clear, any discussion of the thorny issue of whether or not perception involves non-conceptual content should first be clear regarding how we do understand, and how we should understand, 'content', 'perception', and 'concept'. Hopp is admirably clear and persuasive concerning what we are trying to say when we talk about intentional content, and equally clear regarding perception. Hopp's use and understanding of the word 'concept', however, is somewhat less clear. And this relative lack of clarity partially undercuts what is otherwise his powerful defense of the view that perception involves a radically different kind of content from the conceptual content that is instantiated in judgment and belief.

As Hopp correctly points out, contemporary discussions of intentional content in general, and of non-conceptual perceptual content in particular, are bedeviled by a fair amount of confusion regarding exactly what we are talking about when we discuss the 'content' of an intentional act. According to Hopp there are two broad kinds of views concerning the content of acts. Either the content is seen as a property of the act or it is associated with the immediate objects of the act. Relying heavily on Husserl's early account in Logical Investigations, Hopp argues that the content of an act is an intrinsic property of that act; it is the property that Husserl identifies as the matter, as opposed to the quality, of the act. In a passage that Hopp quotes, Husserl characterizes the quality of an act as "the general act-character, which stamps an act as merely presentative, judgmental, emotional, desiderative, etc." On the other hand, Husserl identifies the matter of an act as "that moment in an objectifying act which makes the act present just this object in just this manner". That is, for the early Husserl the matter of the act is the property of the act in virtue of which that act presents a particular object as being such and such, as when one perceives a pen to be red or believes that the dog is sleeping. And, Hopp adds, "I will use the term 'content' to mean what Husserl means by 'matter'" (p. 30).

So, for Hopp the content of an intentional act is the intrinsic property of that act in virtue of which the act intends its object as being in some way or other. The content is thus to be radically distinguished from the act's object, direct or indirect. When I see a pen to be cylindrical the only object that is in view is the pen; there is no intermediate object that I intend, no sense datum or appearance through which I relate to the pen. The quality of my perceptual act is that it is perceptually presentative; the content is that the act has the property of presenting this pen to be cylindrical; the object of the act is the pen itself. When I believe that my dog is sleeping the quality of the act is that it is judgmental; the content is that it has the property of intending my dog to be sleeping; its object is my dog. In the latter case, the proposition 'My dog is sleeping' is instantiated in my judgmental act, but it is not the object of some propositional attitude of belief. So, as Hopp puts it, on this view "Propositions and their constituents are 'in' the mind as properties, not as parts, and not as intentional objects" (p. 31).

That Hopp consistently uses 'content' in this way has a number of advantages, not least of which is that it serves to make clear what is at issue when he discusses the content of a kind of mental act, such as perception. On the other hand, the suggestion that the intentional features of an act are just intrinsic properties of that act, with no further specification of what it is about that act that gives it the intentional properties that it has, runs the risk, as Hopp recognizes, of treating intentionality as a 'magical' property. In response, he says that since intentional acts are individuated by their content, they are essentially of what they are of. "It does not make sense to ask how intentional contents themselves come to possess their intentional properties", because "they are intentional properties", and the acts that have those properties are "intrinsically and essentially about" their objects (p. 36). This response would seem to miss the point of the complaint, however. That point is that we would like to know how the intentional properties of mental acts fit in with the rest of what we know to be the case about the world. To just be given an account that insists that we have a description of some agent according to which that agent engages in an act that is essentially about some object, while at the same time we have another description of an agent at the same space/time location according to which that agent doesn't engage in any such act, without any discussion of how those agents and those descriptions are related, is precisely the set of considerations that lead to the intuition that there is something magical involved in the account.

Hopp is equally clear about the nature of perception. Once again he relies on Husserl. Intentional acts are divided into two fundamental kinds, signitive acts and intuitive acts. It is possible to think of my dog when he is at home and I am at the office. But thus thinking of him is quite different from currently seeing him lying on the floor of my study, or even imagining him lying on the floor. The first kind of act is merely signitive; the second kind is intuitive. For Hopp, following Husserl: "Perceptual acts are the paradigmatic sort of intuitive act. In them, the object intended is not thought about or represented. It is present 'in person' or 'in the flesh'" (p. 103). But if the perception is to present an object, that is, a continuing identical entity that can be presented in different perceptions at different times, the perceptions that present an object 'in the flesh' must contain more than what is actually presented at a time. Again following Husserl, Hopp thinks of the intentional content of perceptions, the property of perceptions in virtue of which a perception is of or about some object, in terms of the 'horizons' implicit in the perceptual act, where the 'horizon' is understood as a body of 'empty' intentions that accompany the actual presentation. "In what follows, I will understand the horizon of an act, not as a set of possible intuitively filled intentions, but as a living body of actual empty ones" (p. 55). So, for example, when I see the red pen I see it as roughly cylindrical, even though what is actually present in my current perception is only the facing surface of the pen, which of course is not, itself, cylindrical. On Hopp's view, to see the pen as cylindrical involves the fact that, when I am presented with the facing surface of the pen I always co-intend its non-actually currently visible surface, but do so in an empty fashion. That is, in a manner analogous with the way in which in thought one merely signitively intends an object through intentions that specify what would be the case were I to be actually presented with the merely thought of object, the horizons of perceptual acts specify what would be seen were my perspective on the object different than it currently is by actually, but emptily, pre-delineating those expected perceptions.

But for Hopp it is crucial that the empty horizonal intentions that do the heavy intentional lifting in perception are merely analogous with, and not identical with, the empty signitive intentions that do the heavy lifting when we think of non-present entities. For Hopp it is the difference between these two kinds of empty intentions, along with the fact that perceptions are presentative, that marks the distinctiveness of perception. That these empty intentions are different in kind can be seen, he says, by noting the following considerations. If we compare the judgment that the non-intuited parts of the pen are cylindrical with the perceptual horizonal intention of its cylindricality we can note that

such a judgment can be performed even when (1) the rear side comes into view and is therefore intuited and (2) the object is not perceptually present at all. Here the horizonal content varies or disappears entirely while the judgment remains constant. But if horizonal contents can vary independently of any conceptual contents, then they cannot be identical with any conceptual contents (p. 147).

Seeing an object is one thing; thinking of it is another. And even though when we see the object we intend it through empty horizonal intentions, those intentions are 'intimately bound up with', indeed, inseparable, from an act of intuitive presentation, while mere thinking is, essentially, detachable from any actual intuitive presentation.

Hopp uses an elaboration of this argument to show that perception has non-conceptual content. Roughly, the content of a perceptual act ("that moment in an objectifying act which makes the act present just this object in just this manner") is horizonal and intuitive, and thus non-detachable. But to say that a content is non-detachable is just to say that it is non-conceptual. So perceptual acts are non-conceptual. The strength of this argument depends upon what is meant by 'concept' and 'conceptual content', and, in particular, on the equation of non-detachability and non-conceptuality, for the second premise of the argument depends upon this identification. And, indeed, Hopp insists on this identification of the conceptuality of a content and its detachability. He suggests both the 'detachability thesis', DT:

C is a conceptual content only if it is a detachable content, that is, it is possible for C to serve as the content of a mental state M in which the relevant objects, properties and/or states of affairs that C is about are not perceptually or intuitively present to the subject of M (p. 105),

and the following definition: "I propose, then, that C is a conceptual content if and only if C does not determine, and is not determined by, the intuitive character of any experience E" (p. 142). (Hopp goes on to qualify this definition, but none of the qualifications are relevant to the present discussion.) But it is unclear to me that as Hopp uses them either 'detachability' or that the notion of 'a content being determined by the intuitive character of an experience' are well defined, and since conceptual content is defined in terms of those notions, it is also unclear to me that 'conceptual content' as he uses it is well defined.

The thought behind Hopp's definition of 'conceptual content' is that the content of a perceptual experience, E, is tied to the fact that E is the very intuitive presentation it is, because it is tied to the particular, definite, empty horizon that is implicit in E. Judgments, on the other hand, have a content that is independent of any particular act of intuitive presentation because judgments can intend their objects, specify what would be the case were their objects to be, even when there is no intuitive presentation of the object at all. For Hopp, judgments have this ability because they are constituted by concepts, and for that reason, detachability from intuition is the mark of the conceptual. But even if one accepts all of this, it might not be sufficient to imply that the contents of perceptual acts are different from the contents of empty signitive acts in that the former, but not the latter, are non-conceptual. After all, as Hopp himself reports in the passage in which he introduces his notion of 'content' as the Husserlian matter of an act, Husserl distinguishes the matter of an act from its quality, and for Husserl the quality of the act is "the general act-character, which stamps an act as merely presentative, judgmental, emotional, desiderative, etc." Thus the mark of qualitative differences in acts is that two acts that share a content can differ in quality; for example, the content of my judgment that my dog is asleep is the very same content as my mere thought that he is asleep. And, similarly, one might think that the differences between perceptual and merely signitive acts are differences in the quality of the acts rather than differences in content. In that case, since my thought that my dog is asleep and my perception that my dog is asleep share an identical content, though they differ in quality, the content of my perception itself is detachable, and thus conceptual, even though the ways in which the acts present that content are radically different. So Hopp needs to exclude this possibility, and it is not clear to me that he has done this.

Consider the one and a half year old who can perceptually sort blocks according to their shapes and fluidly place them in the appropriate holes in the top of a shape-sorting box. To have this skill is to be able to repeatedly place different blocks into different holes, that is, to sort a variety of blocks according to their shapes. (This same child might not be capable of thinking about either those blocks or their shapes in a detached manner, but as Hopp remarks this doesn't decide the issue about the detachability of the contents of her acts; the contents of an act can be detachable even if the agent of that act is incapable of performing such a detached act.) If we had to describe the perceptual intentions of the child regarding a particular block that she can sort in this way, we would need to say that she intends this block as cylindrical, and this, of course, is a detachable content, albeit she cannot herself detach that content and intend the block's shape in an entirely empty fashion. In one sense, the manner in which she intends the block is as having a particular shape, although in another sense the manner in which she intends the block is perceptually. Now Hopp would say that even though the object of the girl's intention is the being cylindrical of the block, the content of that intention does not consist in and is not constituted by the concepts of 'block', 'cylindrical', etc. (pp. 139-41). But exactly what criterion could be used to determine whether or not a given content consists in or is constituted by concepts? On the alternative interpretation, the way in which the child's act possesses the content 'the block is cylindrical' is through empty horizonal intentions, but that is an issue having to do with the quality of her act of perception, not having to do with the content of that perception, which is the very same content as the content of the thought that this block is cylindrical, that is, that this block can fit into that hole, but these others cannot. On this alternative view, what that content consists in is partially determined by the appropriate concepts in both cases, and the girl possesses the requisite concepts, in the sense that her perceptual acts instantiate those concepts, although in her case she cannot intend those concepts themselves. And, as far as I can see, nothing Hopp says precludes this alternative.

It thus seems to me that Hopp has not quite clinched his case in favor of the non-conceptual content of perceptual acts. Nevertheless, it is clear that in Perception and Knowledge he has produced a valuable contribution to the ongoing debates concerning the nature of perception, the contents of perceptual states, and the epistemic relation of perceptions and beliefs. It is an excellent and well-argued book, and richly deserves careful study.