Perception as a Capacity for Knowledge

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John McDowell, Perception as a Capacity for Knowledge, Marquette University Press, 2011, 57pp., $15.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780874621792.

Reviewed by Tim Black, California State University, Northridge


For the past three decades, give or take a year or two, John McDowell has been trying to draw epistemologists' attention to what he calls a blind spot in their theorizing. Occupying this blind spot is a view that maintains, when we see it as a view concerning perceptual warrant and perceptual knowledge, that perception is a capacity "to get into states that consist in having a certain feature of the objective environment perceptually present to one's self-consciously rational awareness" (p. 37), so that "in non-defective exercises of a perceptual capacity subjects get into perceptual states that provide indefeasible warrant for perceptual beliefs" (p. 38). It is the primary purpose of his 2011 Aquinas Lecture, Perception as a Capacity for Knowledge, to remind us once again of this blind spot. He maintains that seeing and appreciating the view that lies in the blind spot "will point us towards helpful lessons about the epistemology of perceptual knowledge" (p. 27), and I think he is absolutely right about that. Too often, I believe, epistemologists fail to take into account the sort of view that McDowell lays out; indeed, it can sometimes seem that epistemologists ignore it altogether. It is to the detriment of epistemology to do this.

What's in the blind spot is a view about "observational knowledge as a kind of knowledge whose instances are self-conscious rationality at work" (p. 11).[1] McDowell finds this way of thinking about observational knowledge in Wilfrid Sellars's "Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind." On a Sellarsian approach to observational knowledge, an instance of observational knowledge is "an act of reason" (p. 10), where this means, at least in part, that when "someone has a bit of knowledge of the sort Sellars is concerned with, she can state not only what she knowledgeably believes, but also how her believing it is rationally grounded in a way that shows the belief to be knowledgeable" (p. 10). More specifically, in addition to being able to state what one knowledgeably believes, there are two conditions on this sort of observational knowledge. First, "a report [of such knowledge] must have an authority that consists in its issuing from a reliable capacity," such as "the capacity to know the colours of things by seeing them" (p. 11). Second, as Sellars says in Section 35 of "Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind," that authority must "be recognized by the person whose report it is."

This approach to observational knowledge is epistemologically internalistic: "the warrant by virtue of which a belief counts as knowledgeable is accessible to the knower" (p. 17). Given this, an objection arises: It can seem as if this sort of epistemological internalism comes with "an implausible intellectualism" (p. 24), since it seems to require that one has the ability not only to cite a perceptual state as an epistemic warrant but also to say why the warrant that state provides is not undermined or defeated. McDowell puts the objection, as he finds it in Tyler Burge's "Perceptual Entitlement" (Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 67 (2003): 503-48) this way:

One would need to argue that, though the warrant provided by the perceptual state is defeasible, it is not defeated on this occasion. That would require working with some notably sophisticated concepts: defeasible warrant, defeating conditions, considerations that warrant one in discounting the possibility that one's perceptual warrant is defeated in the present circumstances (pp. 28-9).

And it is implausible to demand this sort of conceptual sophistication from ordinary epistemic agents.

McDowell maintains, however, in defense of his Sellarsian approach, that this objection depends "on the assumption that the warrant a perceptual state provides for a belief cannot guarantee the truth of the belief" (p. 30). His approach to observational knowledge denies this crucial assumption, just as his approach to knowledge of other minds, in his excellent "Criteria, Defeasibility, and Knowledge" (in his Meaning, Knowledge, and Reality, Harvard UP, 1998) denies the assumption that criteria for something "internal" could be satisfied even when "the ascription for which they are criteria [is] false" (CDK, p. 380). In the present case, McDowell maintains that perceptual states themselves can provide indefeasible warrant for beliefs; there is an "indefeasible connection" (CDK, p. 385) between one's being in a certain perceptual state -- for example, one's seeing that something is green -- and one's having a particular bit of perceptual knowledge. To in a certain kind of perceptual state is a way of telling how things are in the objective environment, which makes it natural to say that when one is in a perceptual state of this kind, one thereby knows how things are in the objective environment.

But why do epistemologists maintain that perception provides only defeasible warrant for beliefs? Because, as McDowell thinks Burge will suggest, "any perceptual capacity is fallible" (p. 35); for any perceptual capacity, it sometimes fails to do what it is specified as a capacity to do. From this claim, McDowell suggests, Burge and others will conclude that "perceptual states, in themselves, can provide only defeasible warrant for beliefs" (p. 34). McDowell maintains, however, that one would make "a mistake about the concept of fallibility" (p. 36) if one were to make this inference. It can sometimes seem as if the mistake McDowell has in mind here is simply the thought that fallibility entails defeasibility. This is a mistake because although we certainly ought to see perception as fallible, even when we think of it as Sellars does, it is nevertheless the case that "when all goes well in the operation of a perceptual capacity of a sort that belongs to its possessor's rationality, a perceiver enjoys a perceptual state in which some feature of her environment is there for her, perceptually present to her rationally self-conscious awareness," in which case "the warrant for belief that the state provides is indefeasible; it cannot be undermined" (pp. 30-1). Given a Sellarsian conception of "perceptual knowledge as a rational achievement" (p. 56), fallibility does not entail defeasibility; the fallibility of our perceptual capacities is consistent with the fact that certain perceptual states provide indefeasible warrant.

I think, though, that there is more to be said here. According to McDowell, the inference from fallibility to defeasibility works, when it does, if it does, only because it is made against the backdrop of the assumption that perception is not the sort of capacity McDowell takes it to be. The problem, then, is that theorists, in assuming a particular view of perception, pass over a perfectly legitimate alternative view. Once again, this alternative view is one according to which perceptual capacities are capacities "to get into states that consist in having a certain feature of the objective environment perceptually present to one's self-consciously rational awareness" (p. 37). Through such capacities, we know certain things about the objective environment and we know that it is through those very capacities that we know whatever it is we know about the objective environment.

Now, Burge and others will likely grant that we know certain things about the objective environment through our perceptual capacities. Yet, for these theorists, when we have perceptual knowledge, we need not have it self-consciously: Perceptual knowledge is externalistic, which means that it is something we can have even when we are not aware that we have it. These folks will deny that perceptual capacities themselves put us in a position to know "that it is through perception that one knows whatever it is that one knows about the environment" (pp. 41-2). For these theorists, if perception works to give us knowledge of the objective environment, it does so on something like the following model:

when I see that things are thus and so, I take it that things are thus and so on the basis of having it look to me as if things are thus and so. And it can look to me as if things are thus and so when they are not; appearances do not give me the resources to ensure that I take things to be thus and so, on the basis of appearances, only when things are indeed thus and so. If things are indeed thus and so when they seem to be, the world is doing me a favour [in satisfying the other condition on knowledge, the truth condition]. (John McDowell, "Knowledge and the Internal," in his Meaning, Knowledge, and Reality, p. 396)

To say that perception is fallible, on this model, is to say something like this: perceptual appearances, even when I am as careful as I can be in using my perceptual capacities, do not ensure that things are indeed as I perceptually take them to be. From this picture of the fallibility of our perceptual capacities, it does indeed seem to follow that our perceptual capacities can provide only defeasible warrant for beliefs.

The problem with this model of perceptual knowledge is that it leaves facts about the objective environment "outside the reach of [our] rational powers" ("Knowledge and the Internal," p. 403); such facts are outside the reach of the sort of perception with which Sellars is concerned, perception that yields a kind of knowledge whose instances are self-conscious rationality at work. To bring facts about the objective environment within our reach, we need, on this model, something other than the sort of perceptual experience with which Sellars is concerned. We must appeal to or make use of something else, whatever that might be, if we are to bring such facts within our reach. But this something else, this additional sense, is "a sense denied to men," as O. K. Bouwsma puts it ("Descartes' Evil Genius," Philosophical Review 58 (1949), p. 151). And McDowell agrees with Bouwsma here, saying that "experience is the only mode of cognition -- the only mode of acquisition of epistemic standing -- that is operative" (CDK, p. 374). On this model, then, it looks as if the objective environment will forever remain beyond the reach of our rational powers. The fact that epistemologists seem to insist on working only with this model, and then on trying to attain an objective environment that the model makes unattainable, can make the epistemological enterprise seem pointless, if not flat-out ridiculous.

McDowell also argues that his conception of perceptual knowledge can support a more direct response to the charge of excessive intellectualism. He says,

There is no excessive intellectualism in a conception of a capacity in whose exercise a subject acquires knowledge that is grounded, and known by her to be grounded, in the perceptual presence to her of objective states of affairs. An ordinary adult human being might not put it in those terms, but that is what she would mean if she said something like "I can tell a green thing when I see one". It does not require much sophistication to be able to claim such capacities. (pp. 32-3)

So far, then, McDowell has defended his Sellarsian conception of perceptual knowledge against criticisms of a certain sort. But why think that that conception, which is an internalistic one, is to be preferred over its externalistic rivals? McDowell says, "If … it is wrong to suppose there is no alternative [to an externalistic conception of perceptual knowledge], the idea can be simply dismissed; we can recognize that it does not really accommodate perceptual knowledge at all" (p. 53). No one, he suggests, will "accept that a belief warranted by a perceptual state that leaves open a possibility that the belief is false could nevertheless count as knowledgeable, if that did not seem to be the only possible way to ensure that there is such a thing as perceptual knowledge" (p. 53). One of the benefits of the Sellarsian view, then, is that it can accommodate perceptual knowledge while its externalistic rivals cannot.

McDowell's Sellarsian conception of perception can also help with what some take to be tricky issues in epistemology. For example, Michael Bergmann, in his Justification without Awareness (Oxford UP, 2006), suggests that internalisms, including those of the sort McDowell advocates, face a dilemma. Bergmann (pp. 14-5) formulates the internalist's position as follows:

S's belief B is justified only if (i) there is something, X, that contributes to the justification of B and (ii) S is actually aware of X in such a way that S justifiedly believes that X is in some way relevant to the appropriateness of holding B.

According to Bergmann, this leads to a vicious regress, since to be justified in believing that X is in some way relevant to the appropriateness of holding B, one needs another justified belief; and to be justified in holding that belief, one needs yet another justified belief; and so on ad infinitum. Now, it might well be that we need at some point, and in some sense, justifiedly to believe that certain perceptual experiences are in some way relevant to the appropriateness of holding certain beliefs. For McDowell, however, this is most plausibly seen as a condition for one's being able to claim the reliability of perceptual capacities. And the reliability one "must be able to claim is a condition for her to be able to have experiences in which she sees that things are green [for example]" (p. 13). Given this, in order for one to be justified in believing that something is green, one need not justifiedly believe that seeing that it is green -- or even that having a visual experience as of its being green -- is in some way relevant to the appropriateness of believing that it is green. As McDowell says (p. 34), it is a confusion to think that the warrant one claims to have, when one cites a perceptual state in offering a justification, is constituted by a belief about the perceptual state rather than by the perceptual state itself: "[One's] warrant for believing the thing is green is that she can see that it is… . it is such experiences that warrant her in believing, and saying, that things are green" (p. 13). In seeing how an internalism of McDowell's sort helps to avoid Bergmann's criticisms of internalistic epistemologies, we have discovered yet another benefit of McDowell's approach.

With all the advantages it brings to epistemology -- it is consistent with the fallibility of our perceptual capacities, it puts the objective environment within the reach of our rational powers, it involves no excessive intellectualism, it can accommodate perceptual knowledge in a way that competing views cannot, and it stands up to prominent criticisms of internalistic epistemologies -- McDowell's Sellarsian approach to perceptual knowledge is not one that we can afford to ignore. Neither can we afford to ignore Perception as a Capacity for Knowledge. It is yet another invitation to see a view that occupies what is still a blind spot in much epistemological theorizing, and it is an elegant and accessible account of McDowell's conception of perceptual knowledge and of the good it can do in and for epistemology.

[1] There are worries regarding exactly how perception can be an act of reason, given that our perceptual capacities seem, in large part at least, to operate involuntarily and anterior to reason. McDowell addresses these concerns in his Mind and World (Harvard UP, 1994), where he says, for example, that "the passive operation of conceptual capacities in sensibility is not intelligible independently of their active exercise in judgement, and in the thinking that issues in judgement" (p. 12). In "Knowledge and the Internal" (p. 407 n. 18), he says, "Our being able to count as, say, seeing that things are thus and so depends on our being properly sensitive (where "properly" expresses a rational assessment) to how things look to us." And there is, of course, much more on this issue in McDowell's work.