Perception, Hallucination, and Illusion

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William Fish, Perception, Hallucination, and Illusion, Oxford UP, 2009, 198pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195381344.

Reviewed by Matthew Kennedy, University of Nottingham



Two familiar theories in the philosophy of perception are the sense-datum theory and adverbialism, both of which were popular at different points during the twentieth century. Recently two somewhat novel options in philosophy of perception have appeared, and indeed taken centre stage in the debate. The first is contemporary representationalism, advocated by Gilbert Harman, Michael Tye, and others. The second newcomer, or returnee, is naïve realism. In the last ten years or so, a very sizeable new body of literature on naïve realism has quickly developed.1

William Fish’s Perception, Hallucination, and Illusion is perhaps the first book-length defense of naïve realism and associated doctrines to appear as part of this new work. It is a substantial contribution. Fish communicates a clear sense of the philosophical landscape that naïve realists confront, and defends a stimulating proposal about how naïve realists should deal with key parts of this landscape. In filling out his naïve-realist account of perception, Fish addresses a wide range of topics of current interest in the field, including attention, conceptual and recognitional capacities, and the metaphysics of color. Fish’s discussion of these topics often draws on relevant work from psychology. His most extensive engagement with scientific work on perception comes in chapter 5, where he challenges the apparent empirical basis of some entrenched ideas about the phenomenal character of experience.

Turning to some criticisms, readers may want more positive motivation for naïve realism than Fish provides. Furthermore, I believe that Fish’s account of hallucinations faces serious problems. Nonetheless, the book as a whole is a clear presentation of an intriguing and comprehensive naïve-realist view, a work that sharpens our understanding of the debate to which this theory contributes.

Fish’s naïve realism makes claims about the structure and phenomenal character of veridical experience. Fish characterizes the structure of veridical experience in terms of a subject being visually acquainted with a physical object and its perceptible properties. Further, he identifies the phenomenal character of veridical experience with the property of being visually acquainted with these external items. On this view, the subjective dimension of veridical experience is world-involving, consisting in a relation of acquaintance to external things. At least for present purposes, these claims define the naïve-realist position.

A broad consequence of this position is that veridical conscious experience and hallucinatory conscious experience are importantly not the same. Since there is no real prospect of analyzing hallucinations in terms of our being visually acquainted with physical objects, naïve realists must offer some other account of hallucinations. There are a range of theoretical options here that constitute an important choice point.

All naïve realists hold that veridical experiences and hallucinations differ in some important way. We can usefully classify these theorists in terms of the magnitude and character of the difference that they posit between the two states.2 A somewhat moderate naïve-realist position would say that although veridical experiences and hallucinations are importantly different, they are both intentional states. A more severe naïve-realist position rejects an intentional account of hallucination, but still accepts that veridical experience and hallucination both have phenomenal characters, perhaps different phenomenal characters. Michael Martin has a position of this type.3

Fish’s view, as he is well aware, is even farther out on our working spectrum. One of main efforts is to argue, in the service of naïve realism, that hallucinations lack phenomenal character. According to him, we can account for all the relevant features of hallucinations without attributing phenomenal character to them. Natural glosses on this view are that hallucinations are not conscious states, and that hallucinations lack a “what it’s like” aspect. (Fish does allow that hallucinations have a “felt reality”, but this does not amount to possession of phenomenal character; see pp. 96-101).

The reappearance of naïve realism, and the development of somewhat radical forms of it, should focus our attention on two questions. First, what are the motivations for accepting naïve realism in the first place? Second, what is the line of thought that connects the viability of naïve realism with eye-catching claims about the nature of hallucination? In this review I will focus on Fish’s discussion of these questions, and his claim about hallucinations.

The main motivation for naïve realism that Fish cites in chapter 1 is that the theory provides the most descriptively accurate account of veridical experience. This type of phenomenological argument for naïve realism has been advanced by Michael Martin and other writers, including Benj Hellie. Fish follows Hellie in his chapter 1 discussion (pp. 18-23; compare Hellie, “Factive Phenomenal Characters”, Philosophical Perspectives 21 (2007)). Many philosophers have observed, on phenomenological or first-person grounds, that veridical perception seems to involve immediate awareness of external things; perception seems to put us in direct contact with these items. For instance, Joseph Levine writes, “The ripe tomato seems immediately present to me in experience. I am not in any way aware of any cognitive distance between me and the scene in front of me … the world is just there” (quoted at Fish, p. 20).4 These first-person judgments about perception either straightforwardly depict perception as involving acquaintance with external items, or at least they push in that direction. Moreover, these first-person judgments about perception are made by experts in what we can suppose are ideal conditions. We might think these judgments, with these origins, are guaranteed to be right (this is roughly the claim in Hellie’s argument); or, at least, these judgments have heavy evidential standing. Expert first-person judgments about perception support a naïve-realist understanding of it and militate against other theories. Fish distinguishes this type of informed phenomenological support from the familiar idea that naïve realism is the favored theory of the common man.

Turning to other sources of motivation for naïve realism, some philosophers have argued that naïve realism offers advantages in debates about scepticism, and in debates about our capacity to think about external objects. In chapter 1 Fish describes these arguments for naïve realism but is noncommittal about their force (pp. 23-28). He goes no farther than the suggestion that they help to generate interest in the theory’s prospects. In later chapters Fish claims some advantages for naïve realism in connection with the hard problem of consciousness, and with the “binding” problem in neuroscience (pp. 75-79; pp. 139-140). However, I’m afraid I thought that both discussions were too condensed to add much to Fish’s positive case for naïve realism.

Fish focuses more on defending naïve realism from central objections than on motivating the theory. But this overall strategy is somewhat unsatisfying given the radical character of Fish’s responses to these objections. Since the radical nature of his replies will lead us to ask about associated motivations of the naïve-realist package, it would have been better to have in place a more extensive positive case for the theory.

In his second chapter, Fish clearly lays out how the arguments from illusion and hallucination help to shape the agenda for naïve realism. Focusing on hallucination (he discusses illusions in chapter 6), the central task that emerges for the naïve realist is to explain the possibility of subjectively indistinguishable pairs of veridical and hallucinatory experiences.

The traditional explanation of subjective indistinguishability is that hallucinations and veridical experiences have identical phenomenal characters. A similar proposal is that these states are mentally wholly the same. Naïve realists reject these ideas, and aim to explain the subjective indistinguishability of hallucinations and veridical experiences via some other means.

What considerations shape the naïve-realist response to the argument from hallucination? Among other lines of thought, there is a set of broadly causal considerations, which we can introduce in terms of the claim that the phenomenal character of visual experience is a “locally supervenient” phenomenon. Many philosophers believe that the phenomenal character of a token visual experience is fixed by the internal or narrow state of the experiencing subject. If this is right, the phenomenal character of a veridical, perceptual experience can be replicated in the absence of the perceived object.

Many philosophers see the local-supervenience thesis as drawing support from scientific work on perception. Fish aims to undermine this impression in his chapter-five discussion of the local-supervenience thesis and relevant empirical work. Here I focus on how the local-supervenience thesis interacts with naïve-realist attempts to respond to the argument from hallucination.

The local-supervenience thesis provides one way to articulate the idea that the properties that we assign to hallucination will be present in veridical experience too, on the grounds that the two states share narrow causes. This idea threatens the distinctive account of veridical experience that naïve realists wish to promote. Very broadly, suppose we think that hallucinations have a certain mental property, and we think that veridical experiences share this property, again due to the shared narrow causes of the two states. This shared, or “common”, property may be able to explain aspects of veridical experience that naïve realists intend to explain in terms of their relational conception of veridical experience. The presence of the common property in veridical experience makes available an alternative understanding of the aspects of veridical experience that are of interest to naïve realists. In increasingly prominent terms, the common property threatens to “trump” or “screen off” naïve-realist relational properties in our explanations of relevant features of veridical experience (see Fish, pp. 84-85).

Martin and Fish aim to provide accounts of hallucination which will not bite them in this manner even if the resources invoked in these accounts are also present in veridical experience. It is the screening off worry that pushes some naïve realists to posit large differences between veridical and hallucinatory experiential states. (A brief aside is that the present reviewer thinks that this is a case of undue influence.) The intent behind Fish’s claim that hallucinations lack phenomenal character is to avoid the screening-off problem (p. 93).

Martin describes hallucinations simply in terms of their being indiscriminable from veridical perceptions. (Notice that Martin’s account of hallucination does not aim to explain subjective indistinguishability; he reverses direction and employs this idea itself as an explanatory resource). Many philosophers have criticized Martin’s conception of hallucination (see Fish, pp. 89-93). Fish’s own account of hallucination can be understood as a similar effort which aims to avoid the objections to Martin.

In chapter 4, Fish analyzes the subjective indistinguishability of a pair of veridical and hallucinatory experiences in terms of the respective experiences leading to the same “cognitive effects”, where these can include combinations of beliefs, judgments, and behavioral effects. To a first approximation, a token pair of experiences h and v are subjectively indiscriminable if and only if h lacks phenomenal character, but has the same cognitive effects as v. (It’s questionable how well this approach secures the epistemic idea that certain hallucinations involve an inability to know that one is not seeing, but I will not pursue this point.)

A parallel project that Fish pursues is to sort token hallucinations into rough kinds: into hallucinations as of bananas, hallucinations as of giraffes, etc. (In fact for Fish this project seems to be the same project as the project of explaining indiscriminability; see p. 95). Fish pursues this classification project via the same schema: to a first approximation, an episode e is an hallucination of an F if and only if e lacks phenomenal character but is isomorphic in downstream effects to some possible token veridical perception of an F.

However, complications ensue because we may have antecedent views about the kind or type of a particular hallucinatory episode that are not vindicated by the formulations currently on offer (pp. 102-103). Suppose that episode e includes the subject’s belief that he sees a banana. If e is an hallucination, it looks like it should be classified as an hallucination as of a banana. However, episode e shares effects with, e.g., a veridical perception of a piano, which leads to a wayward belief that one sees a banana. So we are threatened with an intuitively incorrect classification of e as an hallucination as of a piano.

Fish addresses this problem by invoking rationality (p. 103). Roughly, his revised proposal is that an event e is an hallucination of an F iff e lacks phenomenal character but matches the cognitive effects of some possible token perception of an F in a rational subject. The piano perception just outlined is a perceptual episode which seems to involve a failure of rationality (ibid). The present revision is meant to exclude such cases from the project of classifying hallucinations.

However, cognitive effects like beliefs and behavior are not produced simply by a subject’s perceptual experiences and his (presumed) rationality. Rather, the latter resources combine with a subject’s background beliefs and other mental states to produce the relevant effects. As we have seen, Fish’s broad strategy is to analyze indiscriminable pairs of perceptions and hallucinations in terms of their producing the same beliefs and behavior. To ensure this isomorphism Fish requires that the relevant pairs of hallucinatory and veridical experiences involve the same larger mental background (p. 103). In Fish’s terms, indistinguishable hallucinations and veridical perceptions share the same “background beliefs, desires, and other mental states” (p. 95). Fish refers to this mental background as a subject’s “doxastic setting” (ibid).

Fish’s project also suggests a slightly different rationale for the “same doxastic setting” requirement. If a veridical episode and a hallucinatory episode differ in their doxastic backgrounds, then the two episodes differ in a potentially introspectible manner.

Fish’s formal analysis of indiscriminable pure hallucinations is as follows:

For all mental events, e, in doxastic setting D with cognitive effects C (in its subject), e is a pure hallucination of an F, if and only if

e lacks phenomenal character, and

there is some possible veridical visual experience of an F, V, that has a rational subject who is in D and produces C, and

C is nonempty. (p. 94)

Here are some worries about this approach. First, go back to our original episode e, which involved the subject of e‘s belief that he sees a banana. Why should this belief have authority in the project of determining e’s experiential type? Fish does not stipulate that the belief is rational, so it’s not clear why it should function as an anchor in this project. However, I think Fish avoids this stipulation for a reason: the stipulation would be an awkward one, because it would arrive before we classify e as belonging to a particular experiential type.

One reply to my question is that type-classifications of hallucinations are going to be a difficult business if we cannot rely on the phenomenal character of hallucination. Despite their limitations, beliefs of the sort indicated are a good place to start. Although this sounds reasonable enough, I think there is more to be said about Fish’s interest in classifying hallucinations, which I will revisit in a couple of paragraphs.

Second, looking at the second clause of Fish’s definition, I suspect that the predicate "rational subject who is in D" is incoherent with respect to some values of D. As we have seen, doxastic settings are constituted by the whole of a subject’s “background beliefs, desires, and other mental states” (p. 95). Bodies of belief and desire can conflict and exhibit tension in ways that we commonly regard as irrational. Suppose that there are bodies of belief, desire, etc. that rational subjects simply cannot possess, due to the irrationality of these overall mental portfolios. It follows from Fish’s definition that subjects with these irrational mental outlooks cannot have pure hallucinations. Subjects with irrational mental outlooks have no counterpart rational subjects who share these mental outlooks. A certain kind of irrational subject cannot have a pure hallucination, because these subjects do not share mental outlooks with the rational subjects required by the right-hand side of Fish’s analysis of pure hallucinations.

However, we don’t normally think that possession of an irrational mental outlook provides any protection against the occurrence of pure hallucinations. In a later section, Fish aims to distance himself from the idea that “a subject must be rational in order to hallucinate” (4.6, p. 103 n. 25). But in the passage in question he is only considering the impact of the rationality provision of his account. Fish does not consider how this provision interacts with the additional idea of an overall doxastic setting. It’s natural, however, to think that the two notions are not independent: that there are doxastic settings which rational subjects cannot inhabit. Again, we don’t think that these settings are safe havens from pure hallucination. Since the rationality and doxastic-setting provisions appear to have roles to play in Fish’s account, this appears to be a serious problem for his proposal.

Fish attempts to respect our intuitive views about the kind or type of particular hallucinations, while disavowing a main anchor of these intuitions, namely the idea that hallucinations have belief-independent phenomenal character (pp. 102-103). However, the former intuitions may not be worthy of pursuit in a setting that has given up on the latter key idea. I think that if we reject the idea that hallucinations have phenomenal character, then we should no longer regard intuitions about hallucinatory kinds as authoritative; we should no longer try to accommodate them. Fish’s basic proposal is that indiscriminable hallucinations and veridical experiences share their downstream effects, even though the former states lack phenomenal character. I suspect that the most viable development of this idea adopts a more thoroughgoing revisionist stance against common ideas about hallucinations, including common ideas about how they should be classified.

Parts of Fish’s discussion are sympathetic to this sort of stance. Although Fish appears to regard rough classifications of experience as a desideratum, in a later section of his chapter on hallucinations he rejects the project of classifying token experiences into sharp types or kinds (pp. 111-114).

One course of action for naïve realists is to seek to emend Fish’s account of hallucinations, perhaps in a more comprehensively revisionist direction. Another option is to work with Martin’s indiscriminability-based account of hallucinations. Going back to an earlier part of the discussion, a path that I find promising is to query the “screening-off” line of thought that shapes the accounts of Fish and Martin. Others will not welcome the reappearance of naïve realism, and will advocate the preservation of more traditional views. Anyone interested in this debate will benefit from studying Fish’s book.

1 See, e.g., Michael Martin, “The Limits of Self-Awareness”, Philosophical Studies 120: 37-89 (2004), Martin, “On Being Alienated”, in Perceptual Experience, eds. John Hawthorne and Tamar Szabo Gendler, Oxford UP, 2006; John Hawthorne and Karson Kovakovich, “Disjunctivism”, Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society Supp. Volume 80: 145-183 (2006); Disjunctivism: Perception, Action, Knowledge, eds. Adrian Haddock and Fiona Macpherson, Oxford UP, 2008.

2 Similar taxonomic strategies are pursued in Scott Sturgeon, “Disjunctivism About Visual Experience”, in Disjunctivism, eds. Haddock and Macpherson, and Matthew Soteriou, “The Disjunctive Theory of Perception”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2009 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.),

3 See Martin, “The Limits of Self-Awareness” and “On Being Alienated.”

4 Levine, “Conscious Awareness and (Self-)Representation”, in Self-Representational Approaches to Consciousness, eds. Uriah Kriegel and Kenneth Williford, MIT Press, 2006, p. 179.