Perception, Realism and the Problem of Reference

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Athanassios Raftopoulos and Peter Machamer (eds.), Perception, Realism and the Problem of Reference, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 298pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521198776.

Reviewed by Jennifer Matey, Florida International University


Each of the twelve essays in this volume takes up an issue pertaining to one of the three titular topics or, more often, some combination thereof. The essays are tied together by implicit or explicit reference to some aspect of the problem of realism which Raftopoulos and Machamer describe as, "the problem of our access (if any) to the world" (p. 1). In their introductory chapter, they succeed in showing the relevance of some of the issues discussed in the papers on perception and reference to the question of whether perception or linguistic terms put the perceiver into an epistemically direct relation to the world, or whether these relations are instead mediated by our concepts or theories, or are otherwise interest dependent.

This collection will be of interest to anyone concerned with the problem of realism in perception and linguistic reference. Some themes running through the volume include: how perception individuates, picks out and tracks perceptual objects; the relation between embodiment and action and perceptual or linguistic representations; the relation between reference of perceptual demonstratives and linguistic reference; the role of location in perceptual individuation of objects; the validity of common arguments for indirect realism such as the argument from illusion; the role of behavior in reference and whether embodied or situated accounts affect the topic of reference.

The book may be of particular interest to anyone concerned with the issue of realism and reference in the context of scientific theory since several essays address the relation between scientific theories and the phenomena that they represent. These essays in particular make generous use of scientific examples. For instance, in "Scientific representation, denotation, and explanatory power", Demetris Portides discusses the relations between scientific models and the systems they represent using the pendulum system modeled by the linear harmonic oscillator. And Stathis Psillos in "Causal descriptivism and the reference of theoretical terms", uses the case of 'chlorine' to illustrate how causal contact anchors descriptions to referents. Appeal to empirical examples are also found in several other essays; I think this adds to the appeal of the essays and fits with current trends in philosophy. Below, I provide an overview of the particular essays in the volume, some more detailed than others.

Immediately following the editors' introduction is Amanda Brovold and Rick Grush's, "Towards an (improved) interdisciplinary investigation of demonstrative reference". A nice feature of this essay is its extensive incorporation of work on the cognitive science of perception. In the first part, Brovold and Grush take up the issue of how we perceptually track objects. They then discuss demonstrative reference of linguistic expressions. The upshot of the two sections is that, although the orthodox views on each issue might suggest that a theory of perceptual individuation could bear on the issue of demonstrative reference, the revised accounts offered by Brovold and Grush imply this assumption is mistaken.

Brovold and Grush point out that although the orthodox view is that we individuate and track perceptual objects by assigning spatial location, we actually do so by applying gestalt principles. Brovold and Grush argue that the emphasis on location is the result of theorists' misplaced emphasis on the visual modality as representative of perception in general. But location cannot be central to individuating and tracking objects since we sometimes track spatially discontinuous objects, and we sometimes individuate multiple objects occupying the very same spatial location. With respect to the semantics of demonstrative reference, Brovold and Grush argue that the key to understanding demonstrative reference is the concept of the 'control cycle', the respect to which an the entity referred to is under the agent's physical, perceptual, attentional, epistemic or social control. They argue that this view provides a better explanation than others for the proximal distal contrast in demonstrative reference (the use of 'this' or 'that').

Another essay that makes nice use of empirical examples in discussing perception is Derek Brown's, "Losing grip on the world: from illusion to sense-data". Brown argues that the argument from illusion does not support indirect realism, the view that both veridical and illusory experiences offer a relation to the external world that is mediated by projected sense data. The key to Brown's argument is his distinction between two different types of illusions. In some illusions, such as the floating vase illusion, the given stimulus is ambiguous between two interpretations. Importantly however, although the perceiver resolves the visual data in one way rather than the other, the perceiver can still see the stimulus as ambiguous upon reflection. Brown argues that in such illusions, the illusory properties cannot be accounted for by the positing of sense data since this could not explain how we can still experience the perceived scene as being ambiguous. Other illusions, however involve the experience of properties or objects that are not present in the objective stimulus. Since it is common to accept the subjects' data, and perceptual experience is presented as involving existential commitment, here we should interpret the illusory properties as really instantiated. But they aren't instantiated in the external world. Brown argues that this latter type of illusion therefore lends itself to a sense data interpretation. Brown concludes by showing how this distinction bears on the argument from illusion. The argument from illusion relies on inference from the view that illusions in general put us into contact with sense data to the view that all perceptual experiences put us in contact with sense data. But Brown claims that showing that only a limited group of illusions involve awareness of sense data makes the generalization more questionable.

In "Visual demonstratives", Mohan Matthen takes up perceptual reference. He argues that a visual state has some worldly object as its direct epistemic target only if it enables the perceiver to attend to the object and it does this only when it represents the object as occupying an egocentric location, a space relative to the perceiver. Matthen goes on to argue that while some take similar positions and use them as evidence for disjunctivism (e.g., Snowdon), the view doesn't actually supply evidence for disjunctivism. Only objects in real space can get egocentric coordinates, the sort of hallucinations that serve as evidence for disjunctivism, are relevantly dissimilar.

John Campbell's, "Perceiving the intended model", also focuses on the reference of perceptual demonstratives. Campbell argues for a notion of modes of presentation that make location important, and the role that attention, object and feature tracking across location change has on fixing reference. He also discusses the impact that this view has on the issue of what impact, if any, conscious experience might have on epistemic issues such as our knowledge of the intended model for perception and our insight into validity of related inferences.

In, "Individuation, reference, and sortal terms", E.J. Lowe argues that we are able to have singular de re thoughts about objects only when we apply concepts to them which specify a criterion of identity specific to a certain category of objects. Lowe claims that this view, categorialism, best explains why, when we view an object such as a cat, we can conceive of it as either a cat or a hunk of matter. Moreover, categorialism explains how, should these two objects come apart, we can still independently track either or both the cat and the hunk of matter. What enables us to track these objects differently is their different criteria of identity. Lowe then turns to categorialism as a view of linguistic reference, which he argues, is superior to both traditional causal and descriptivist views. On the categorialist view, a speaker successfully refers if she grasps that the name's referent falls under a categorical concept with a criterion of identity. One advantage that categorialism about linguistic reference has over traditional causal and descriptive accounts is that it yields results about reference that are in some cases more consistent with our intuitions. For instance, if one mistakenly uses 'Oscar' in referring to a real cat, but mistakenly thinks it is a porcelain cat, rather than 'Oscar' referring to the real cat as the causal theory would predict, the name fails to refer to any object.

Peter Machamer and Lisa Osbeck's paper, "Action, perception and reference", explores the relations between embodied and situated perspectives on cognition, and theories about reference of percepts and words, both historical and also with an eye to some potential ways in which cross-fertilization between these areas might yet occur. For instance, two notable historical frameworks that acknowledged embodiment and situatedness of cognition were the pragmatist perspective of Dewey and the ecological work of Gibson. Both views prioritized activity, avoided talk of representations, and thus didn't recognize the problem of reference. Machamer and Osbeck assert that some notions of representation are, however, compatible with prioritizing activity and that theories of cognitive development in psychology and linguistics should acknowledge the role of activity on representation and referring.

In "Personal and semantic reference", Gerald Vision argues that what individual a term refers to is determined ultimately by the speaker's intention, highlighting the role of the mental in linguistic reference. That the speaker's intention is important can be seen from the problems presented by incomplete descriptions, where a description is insufficient to determine reference in some cases such as in the expression, "the table is covered with books". If more than one table is present, it is still unclear which table the expression refers to. We then need something in addition to terms in order to single out which table is meant. The problem doesn't arise if the referential value includes the speaker's intention to refer to a particular table.

Don Howard's essay concerns semantic naturalism and deals mostly with the behaviorists' view of reference. He pays particular attention to Skinner's work, which Howard describes as inheriting the legacy of Dewey and achieving a project that Quine was after. Skinner's project didn't have to do with explication of the traditional notion of reference per se, but rather was concerned with the operant analysis of verbal behavior. Much of Howard's discussion of Skinner focuses on the notion of the 'tact'. Howard describes the tact as the closest stand-in for the traditional notion of reference. It involves the functional relationship among stimulus, response and contingencies of reinforcement, with correlation between stimulus and response standing-in for the semantic notion of truth. Howard concludes with a critique of Chomsky's criticism of Skinner for not accounting for verbal behavior's extensive novelty.

Demetris Portides ("Scientific representation, denotation and explanatory power") deals with the relation between scientific theories and the world by discussing how scientific models, the means by which theories are applied to phenomena, represent physical systems. Models are idealizations of physical systems; they represent just certain aspects of a system. Portides develops a denotative account of scientific representation that ties the representational function of scientific models to their explanatory power and makes use of the notion of mechanism. He adopts Goodman's distinction between being a representation of y and being a y representation. Models idealize or simplify the characteristics of their target systems and the way they do this can be well understood by the view that they are y representations of their targets. Portides is strongest when discussing phenomenological models, which are models that represent their target by providing a mechanism or interaction of different mechanisms responsible for the observed behavior of the system. He ties scientific representation to the explanatory function of models. The degree of explanatory power of a model is determined by the level of specificity of the mechanism it represents.

William Bechtel takes up the issue of whether adopting a dynamical systems approach to cognition can be compatible with thinking that specific mental operations can be localized in particular brain areas that researchers can refer to. In the traditional view, component parts of a cognitive system are hierarchically organized. In a dynamical system, parts have reciprocal causal interactions with other parts. Bechtel argues that to reconcile the project of localization with the dynamical systems approach requires that we reconceptualize the project of localization including cognitive operations and brain regions. On the traditional view, brain processing is given a mechanistic explanation and in localization researchers look for a system consisting of distinguishable parts. An important part of Bechtel's reconceptualization involves the appeal to small world networks. Small world networks have specialized components but these components do not operate independently, they are continuously modulated by other brain activity. Bechtel argues that consistent with this view, we should

characterize the components of mechanisms in terms of variables and represent the changes in values of these variables in terms of differential equations. One can then analyze the functioning of mechanisms in terms of the patterns of change over time in properties of their parts and operations, generating dynamic mechanistic explanations (p. 279).

This view of mechanisms is compatible with reference to local clusters specializing in unique operations.

Perception, Realism and the Problem of Reference is a diverse collection that offers an array of subjects that is a bit broader than one might expect in an edited volume like this but ultimately each paper informs and can be informed by several others. The volume has several highlights including some papers on perception which were nicely informed by empirical research. The concluding papers on the topic of reference of scientific theories and terms are another highlight.