Perception, Sensibility, and Moral Motivation in Augustine: A Stoic-Platonic Synthesis

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Sarah Catherine Byers, Perception, Sensibility, and Moral Motivation in Augustine: A Stoic-Platonic Synthesis, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 262pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107017498.

Reviewed by Peter King, The University of Toronto


Augustine has benefited from the attention paid to Hellenistic and post-Hellenistic philosophy in recent years. His indebtedness to the later Platonist tradition has always been apparent, but not his use of Stoic, Skeptic, and Epicurean material. John Rist and Marcia Colish have emphasized Augustine's appropriation of Stoicism in particular -- not surprisingly, since there is a healthy admixture of Stoic doctrine in late Platonism -- and Sarah Byers carries on their investigations in her book, whose fitting subtitle is "a Stoic-Platonic synthesis."

Byers has written a first-rate study, and scholars will be exercised by her exegetical and her philosophical interpretations for some time to come. She makes a definitive case for the virtues of careful study of Hellenistic, post-Hellenistic, and Patristic sources to appreciate Augustine as a philosopher. Indeed, Augustine emerges from the pages of Byers's book as a careful and critical reader of his sources, who disagrees with them for deep and principled philosophical reasons. He stands forth as a critical, innovative, and original thinker, one who could put his finger on exactly what ailed his sources and provide a cure.

Byers opens with an exegetical puzzle. In Confessions 8.11.26-27, Augustine is trying to nerve himself up to embrace Catholicism wholeheartedly, which to his mind requires celibacy. He is torn between his "old loves," which "tugged at the garment of [his] flesh" with worldly temptation, and on the other hand by "the chaste dignity of continence," which was "enticing [him] honorably to come and not to hesitate." Augustine's representation of his inner conflict is usually interpreted as personification, a literary device meant merely to dramatize his dilemma. Byers argues by contrast that Augustine had much deeper aims in mind in portraying his conflict as he does, namely to avail himself of the Stoic account of perception and motivation. She starts with a close analysis of Augustine's terminology in the passage (having to do with "speaking" and "seeing"), which she identifies as traces of Stoic philosophy of mind. Once the idea that Augustine is appealing to a pre-existent conceptual framework has taken hold, Byers spends the rest of her book spelling out exactly what that framework is, its nuances and ramifications, and the extent to which Augustine appropriates and transforms it -- sometimes transforming it to such an extent that its Stoic patrimony is almost completely effaced, though always for sufficient philosophical reasons.

Thus Byers begins her detailed account with an overview of the Stoic theory of perception, in which impressions convey some intelligible content (lekton or enuntiabile) to the cognizer (Chapter 1), all of which is reasonably well-understood and agreed upon by scholars. That Augustine makes use of this framework is also generally acknowledged, and Byers provides careful and detailed proof that he does. We venture out of the scholarly comfort zone shortly thereafter (Chapter 2), when Byers asks how impressions are linked to action. The Stoics reply that there are two components linking them together. First, according to the late report of Stobaeus, some impressions have motivational force (phantasia hormētikē); Byers argues with some plausibility that this theory can be recognized in earlier Stoic texts. Second, as is well known, the Stoics require a (mental) act of assent or consent to such motivating impressions, or to the impulses (hormē) they generate; such an act is or produces the appropriate type of action in the appropriate circumstances when possible. Byers argues by a close analysis of Augustine's text that he adopts both components, the motivating impression and the act of consent, from the Stoics. This is a fact not easily recognized in part because a single Latin word, namely uoluntas, often does duty for each -- though not always; sometimes Augustine uses the term suggestio for the motivating impulse, and often he speaks of adsensio and consensio. (The point is complex enough for Byers to devote her Appendix II to the relation between hormē and uoluntas, a concise and enlightening treatment.) Recognizing that Augustine adopted the Stoic theory of action is a genuine scholarly advance, and it promises to help illuminate the still rather murky debates about whether Augustine "invented" the will, a debate Byers sensibly steers clear of, preferring close analysis to broad claims.

Yet all of this makes Augustine a somewhat derivative thinker. The real breakthrough comes in the next several chapters, when Byers turns to Augustine's general account of affective psychology, for which she takes his theory of the emotions to be foundational (Chapter 3). For here Augustine is not simply content to adopt the Stoic view, even with some modifications; the Stoics notoriously held that emotions were a form of madness, a position to which Augustine does not subscribe. He therefore has to construct a philosophically and psychologically coherent theory of emotions on top of a structure not designed to accommodate them. Roughly, he does so by taking a part of the Stoic account that has always been a bit of a sore spot, the claim that the Sage does experience a few special "good" emotions (eupatheiai), which are compatible with being generally not susceptible to emotions (apatheia). Augustine's line is that many emotions are "good" if they are founded on judgments that apply to the eternal rather than the temporal, or, to the extent that they are founded on the temporal, are relatively brief in duration. In addition, such emotions are not exclusive to the Sage but can be experienced by anyone who recognizes the existence of the eternal source of goodness, namely God -- a "Stoic-Platonic synthesis" as Byers terms it, which has room for compassion and joy, as well as sorrow at the death of a loved one. She again makes her case by careful analysis of key passages. It is both persuasive and a genuine step forward in our understanding of Augustine's theory of affective psychology.

Byers then turns to another sore spot in Stoicism (Chapter 4), namely the controversial theory of "preliminary passions" (propatheiai): unthinking reactions to circumstance, such as the flash of fear upon hearing a lion's roar, even when this is canceled by the immediate realization that the lion is caged in a zoo. The difficulty is that the "flash of fear" seems to be an affective response that is not mediated by any cognitive judgment, which is contrary to the Stoic account of perception and action described above. Just as there was controversy within Stoicism about "good emotions" so too as regards these "preliminary passions." After showing that Augustine recognizes the problem in its Stoic terms in some unlikely places (notably in explaining Biblical passages), Byers ventures the proposal that Augustine identifies a cognitive intermediary for preliminary passions, namely a "dubitative impression" -- or more simply, doubt. Upon hearing the lion roar we are afraid because we are not secure in the knowledge that the lion is caged and can do us no harm; we "doubt" that we are safe. Byers shows that Augustine's account resolves the Stoic puzzle, and that he also applies it to "preliminary" instances of jealousy and anger, again drawing his examples from the Bible.

Augustine's innovation naturally poses a question: why are these "preliminary" emotions rather unfortunate? His answer, as Byers argues (Chapter 5), is that those may be the only ones recognized by the Stoics but there can indeed be "preliminary" versions of "good emotions" as well. To this clever twist Byers offers a further insight: Augustine grounds his view of such preliminary good emotions on the Stoic view that moral progress is possible, or better, as an explanation of what moral progress consists in, about which the Stoics say little. Someone is becoming a morally better person if prone to feel such good emotions, and this is logically prior to having the correct judgments leading one to assent to them. The cognitive cause is again doubt, this time misplaced; as we come to have more and more confidence in the propriety of our responses we recognize that assent to them is appropriate. Augustine is inspired here not by the Stoics but instead, Byers argues, by Philo of Alexandria, whose discussion of doubt Augustine appropriates to his own ends. And once the notion of moral progress is in place, Augustine offers a series of "cognitive therapies" designed to assist our progress (Chapter 6), modeled on Seneca's idea of "prerehearsal" of the various calamities and misfortunes that may befall us, to diminish their fearfulness and overall impact on us. Nonetheless, while we may progress we cannot achieve happiness by our efforts; Byers argues (Chapter 7) that Augustine holds we logically require "inspiration" to succeed in transforming our affective responses, which is her way of introducing Augustine's theory of grace. There is no Stoic or Platonic precursor to this theory, but given the Stoic-Platonic analysis of the preceding chapters Byers offers an ingenious proposal, namely that grace is an instance of a divinely given motivating impression. She rounds this out with a clever reading of the early modern debates over grace (really over ways of interpreting Augustine) between Bañez and Molina, showing that they each miss the point by not understanding Augustine's philosophy of mind correctly.

Byers returns periodically to her initial exegetical puzzle, but eventually it gets left by the wayside in her exploration of Augustine's use of Stoicism -- an odd choice, since by the end of her book she has developed a detailed account of Augustine's philosophy of mind, as well as his account of grace, which could easily be used to explain the exegetical puzzle and much more besides. Perhaps she thought it best to leave it as an exercise for the reader.

The reader should be aware that Byers goes against the scholarly trend in one very significant respect: she makes use of material from Augustine from all over, from early work like the De dialectica to late works such as De gratia et libero arbitrio, and from sermons to Biblical glosses to philosophical dialogues to theological treatises. This is a healthy tonic to the current practice of seeing Augustine's works in isolation, suspecting changes of view from one to the next, or focusing on only one genre of Augustine's voluminous output. Byers does not say, but I suspect her practice is founded on the sound hermeneutical principle that we should presume consistency unless there is reason to think otherwise,. Her book as a whole is an attempt to show that on these matters there is generally no reason to think otherwise. (She does argue, however, that Augustine's thoughts about grace develop over time.) The burden of the argument is on those who would see differences in the material Byers utilizes in her analyses.

Byers handles her sources in Greek and Latin with accuracy and acumen; she is well-versed in the secondary literature; her knowledge of Augustine's texts is impressive. I will be learning from her book for some time to come.