Perceptual Experience

Perceptual Experience

Christopher Hill, Perceptual Experience, Oxford University Press, 2022, 270pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192867766.

Reviewed by Matthew Fulkerson, University of California, San Diego


This book is a comprehensive account of perception that covers an impressive amount of territory. On the one hand it is incredibly ambitious and comprehensive. The range of issues covered is surprisingly wide. The book starts with foundational debates about representational content and defends accounts of the metaphysics of perceptual objects, introspection, pain, the demarcation problem, and the epistemology of perception, among many other topics. Any one of these issues could, and often has been, the subject of its own monograph. On the other hand, the book is a relatively compact read, and never feels bloated or overstuffed. The pacing here is comfortable, measured, and extremely well-organized. Each topic builds on the next, never getting bogged down in minutiae or buried under arcane discussions of the secondary literature.

This is possible in part because the book is a unified presentation of a comprehensive, systematic view of perception, from the foundational questions about the base contents of perceptual experience all the way up to how full-blown perceptual experiences confer epistemic justification on perceptual beliefs. Experts in the individual domains will certainly take issue with the individual local arguments (for examples, see below), but the value of the book is in how these parts fit together and form a unified and coherent conception of perception. While I have quibbles with some of the individual elements, I find the overall systematic picture to be one that is very attractive and promising.

As I said, there’s a lot of stuff going on this book, and each chapter builds upon and circles back to discussions in the earlier sections (small note: Christopher Hill does a great job signposting throughout how the later and earlier sections of the book connect). Hill sets forth five major goals for his book. One is to “advance the cause of representationalism by proposing detailed representationalist accounts of the main dimensions of perceptual experience” (6). As part of this goal, he offers some preliminary accounts of non-perceptual forms of representation, including moods, emotions, and pain. His second goal is to offer an account of the distinction between appearance and reality. This discussion centers on debates between naïve realists, sense data theorists, and the representationalists. His third goal is to defend an account of perceptual phenomenology and consciousness. He argues on this front that all awareness constitutively involves representations. His fourth goal is to the outline the relationship between perception and higher-level cognitive states. He argues that while many cognitive states make use of perceptual outputs (images in reasoning, for example) and while there are lots of interactions between them, perception and cognition are distinct in a strong way. His fifth and final goal is to outline a plausible version of externalism. This is the idea that qualitative properties that constitute phenomenology are external from our internal mental processes.

These goals proceed over the course of its nine chapters. I will spend the remainder of the review highlighting the major claims from each chapter, noting some potential concerns along the way.

In Chapter 1, Hill lays out his vision of perceptual representation. Hill notes that nearly all contemporary cognitive science relies upon the notion of representation. Hill carefully walks through the major lines of reasoning for thinking that mere information-processing is not enough for an account of representation. These include the fact that representations are specific, picking out determinate states or objects, whereas informational content is not; the fact that perception can be mistaken, whereas information alone does not seem to have a notion of error, and that representation has a normative dimension that pure information processing does not. I find the discussion here clear and informative, but the discussion—confined to a single chapter—is more truncated and less comprehensive than similar treatments in recent years from Nicholas Shea (2018) and Karen Neander (2017).

Hill defends a moderate, pluralistic version of teleosemantics. This view trades on the function of certain states to carry distal information. Using the (by now) tired example of a hungry frog responding to a fly in its vicinity, Hill notes that a lot of information is available in the chain from the fly to the frog’s internal strike response. Each subsequent stage of processing carries information about the previous stage, but we want to know what the content of the frog’s representation is. It’s reasonable to think it’s probably something about the visual appearance of the fly (small black object) or something abouts its fitness preserving value (food!) We need an account of how these contents are selected. Hill settles on the idea that teleosemantic functions can narrow our options down to a select set of determinate contents. Rather than settle the matter on a single content, Hill allows that there can be multiple appropriate candidates for that content, so that in the case of the frog, we can eliminate many non-explanatory or implausible candidates, but we will still be left with more than one representational content.

Hill eventually adopts the following necessary condition on representation:

TS: A perceptual state S represents a property P only if it is a function of S to encode information about P.

While there are some interesting side discussions here—on face perception, high level properties, and perceptual learning—the views ultimately defended are part of a popular family of moderate theories of representation that are firmly in the mainstream. The goal of this chapter is more about making clear the specific version Hill prefers rather than convincing opponents to rethink the plausibility of the teleosemantic view.

Chapters 2 and 3 form a connected discussion of appearance and reality in perception. The primary question concerns whether our perceptual experiences provide awareness of the objective properties of objects. One possibility for awareness of objective properties is that we only ever directly experience perspectival properties (like visual angles from a specific viewpoint). At the other extreme, we might experience through perception the objective, viewpoint-independent properties of things. Other options deny we experience objective properties at all, and include versions of sense-data theory and projectivism. Hill defends a novel version of perceptual relativity, one according to which the way things appear depends in part on internal factors (like attention) that are distinct from the objective properties of distal objects. Our awareness of objects depends in part on the contributions made by memory, cognition, and motor control systems working in concert. The argument proceeds by focusing on the visual case and arguing that introspection reveals our contact with appearances rather than objective reality: sizes, shapes, distances, colors, and velocities all vary as an observer moves around from one viewpoint to another. Hill argues that this is clearly the case: “careful attention to one’s experience shows it to be true” (34). I think Hill is partly right about this, but this introspective evidence doesn’t show that we aren’t also aware of more objective properties. Yes, there is a sense in which a tree appears smaller as it moves further away, but there is also a strong introspective feeling that the tree itself is not changing size (and empirical evidence suggests that subjects can variably attend to both sets of features). A tree shrinking before our eyes wouldn’t look the same as it appearing to move further away. The contrast position that is most interesting is that we are aware of both the proximal appearance properties, and objective features of objects (and the latter often through computations done on the former, see Cohen 2010 for discussion of a view like this). Hill does discuss and reject the idea that we have both kinds of content, and argues that awareness of partial constancies is enough, but the discussion of this more compelling option is a bit thin.

The most interesting part of these chapters concerns Hill’s account of appearance properties. Hill argues that we experience through perception Thouless Properties, named after psychophysicist R. H. Thouless. These are partial constancies that are derived from more variable viewpoint-dependent properties like angle and distance. Hill defines Thouless size this way:

The Thouless size of an object x with respect to viewpoint y is F(v, d), where v is the visual angle x subtends with respect to y and d is information pertinent to the distance from x to y. The function F is a “partial-constancy” function, in the sense that its values are more stable than ever-fluctuating retinal images but are nonetheless always characterized by under-constancy. (45)

Hill argues that our perceptual experience is entirely of these Thouless features, and not full constancies. As he notes, “Consider what it would be like if our experience was characterized by full size constancy. All of the antelope scattered across the savannah would have the same apparent size” (48). This leaves out the option that a subject could selectively attend to both the proximal appearances and the more objective features on which they depend. While it’s true that antelope at different distances appear different sizes (in one sense), it also seems true that we can say of two antelope at different distances that they look the same size (in terms of their objective physical sizes). Hill considers the possibility that we experience both features, and he provides a five-part response. These include noting that some objective judgments are, well, judgments, and based on cognition or memory. We don’t see the antelope as the same size, we judge them to be so. He also notes that these judgments are often based on accessing stored memories or motoric routines that can make them seem automatic and perceptual. He also notes that our awareness of objective properties is often much worse than we typically take it to be. I did not find these responses wholly adequate, but Hill is certainly aware of the issue and offers clear responses.

Having argued that perception puts us into contact with Thouless properties, the companion chapter on appearance and reality focuses on some secondary issues. Of particular importance is a section here devoted to non-visual modalities. While the bulk of the book and its examples focus on vision, this chapter does a nice job of including material from non-visual modalities, and I found the discussion of audition, smell, and touch to be welcome. Unfortunately, the discussion here treats the non-visual modalities in a unisensory way, in complete isolation from each other. There’s no discussion of multisensory interactions at all. The pervasive interactions between the senses, especially at very early perceptual stages of processing, would seem to raise many important questions about the structure of perceptual contents, the relation between perception and cognition, about the epistemic role of perception, and the nature of perceptual consciousness. Given the recent focus on multisensory interactions in the philosophy of perception, the absence of any engagement with these sorts of cases was disappointing.

In chapter 4 Hill explores our awareness of particulars, and he provides an argument for existentialism. This view is contrasted with particularism, which holds that particular objects are represented by perceptual experiences. Existentialism instead holds that only general features— that is, content that could be expressed by an existentially quantified proposition—are represented in perception. The argument for existentialism runs through the familiar territory of hallucinations, and Hill spends a little time near the end considering several arguments that undermine support for particularism.

Chapter 5 provides an account of perceptual phenomenology. It offers an account of the phenomenal features of our awareness. Hill argues that we stand in an awareness relation with the appearance properties that constitute our perceptual awareness. Here we get a discussion and rejection of dualism, and an argument that our awareness of qualia is representational. There are two detailed appendices to this chapter, including one on the phenomenology of moods and emotions.

Chapter 6 provides an account of pain. Including a detailed discussion of pain and its unique challenges in a book on perceptual experience is welcome, as it allows Hill to address a number of important issues in presenting his overall views. He argues for a quasi-perceptual form of awareness for pain, where pain itself is a special form of nociceptive awareness combined with an attitudinal theory of painfulness (the negative felt quality associated with pain, what makes it hurt). Pain, according to Hill, is awareness of the activity of nociceptors spread across the periphery. He mentions the famous C-fibers and the familiar A-delta fibers, but he does not discuss the many other known nociceptor types, or the wide range of polymodal nociceptors like those which code for thermal pains. This could present a problem for his views, since some thermal receptor activity will generate experiences of our body warming (say), and only indicate pain after reaching a certain threshold. Hill is aware of this issue, of course, and notes that nociception is defined functionally, but he doesn’t offer any further details about how the functional criterion can handle many difficult cases, from low-threshold thermal perception and the many supposed pains—from seeing very bright lights to hearing loud sounds to central pains—which involve no known nociceptors and don’t obviously project to the same brain regions typically involved in nociceptive pain. I want to note that Hill uses a novel terminological convention for talking about pain processing that I find extremely useful, namely, speaking in terms of N-stimuli, N-processes, N-events, N-states, and N-responses. I think this is a helpful way of thinking about the complexity of pain processing, especially when trying to offer an explanation of pain experiences. Hill ultimately defends the idea that pains are identical with N-events. Hill holds that our current folk categories for pain are often contradictory and incoherent, and he intends this view as a prescriptive account that offers a more explanatory and useful conception of pain.

One issue here is that thinking of pain as awareness of N-events does not account for pain’s motivational or affective qualities. Hill does not think these features are to be found in pain experience, at least not directly. Instead, he argues for an attitudinal view of pain: “motivation comes from our attitudes towards facts. It stems from our evaluations, and our positive and negative attitudes. It isn’t a matter of registering the existence of objects and their factual or “natural” properties” (162). This is not a claim that everyone will endorse. It does seem like moods, emotions, and basic drive states like hunger, thirst, tiredness can be strongly motivating even when they involve no experiential awareness of factual properties, and often in ways that don’t run through explicit attitudes. There are many interesting views that think of pains as involving felt evaluations (Helm 2002) or felt desires (Aydede 2018) or more nuanced version of the attitudinal view (Jacobson 2018) which are not discussed here. In addition, a more compelling engagement with the so-called Euthyphro problem for attitudinal views would have been greatly appreciated (this is the worry that our desire for pains to stop is because they hurt, rather than, as the attitudinal theorist maintains, they hurt because we want them to stop).

One central concern for the attitudinal view is that the empirical evidence seems against it. Kent Berridge is famous for showing a dissociation between liking and wanting, and for showing that the intrinsic motivation of pain and other states cannot be explained by the attitudes we take towards them (the importance of this dissociation for pain is discussed by Corns 2014). Hill cites this work, but Berridge is clear about the import of his findings. In a survey article, Morten Kringelbach and Berridge (2009) describe how the account explains addiction: “At extreme, the addict may come to ‘want’ what is neither ‘liked’ nor expected to be liked, a dissociation possible because ‘wanting’ mechanisms are largely subcortical and separable from cortically-mediated declarative expectation and conscious planning. This is a reason why addicts may compulsively ‘want’ to take drugs even if, at a more cognitive and conscious level, they do not want to do so” (482). This applies equally to pain and other strongly motivating sensory states (like hunger, thirst, and tiredness).

In Chapter 7 Hill gives us an account of consciousness, and an account of how it is related to awareness of phenomenal character. This includes a quick discussion of introspective vs access consciousness. Hill argues that phenomenal consciousness is the intrinsic ground for introspective and access consciousness, and it is realized by high activity in specific regions in the brain. Hill then proceeds to provide a detailed argument for the autonomy thesis, the claim that phenomenal consciousness is separate from, and not dependent on, access.

Chapter 8 concerns the relation between perception and concepts. Hill here argues for a strong separation between perceptual states and propositional attitudes. While sketching a theory of propositional attitudes and thought, Hill argues that perception itself does not involve concepts. The reasons include familiar concerns about fineness of grain and the complexity of perceptual experience (for instance, we can perceive complex patterns on carpets that we have no conceptual categories for). Here we get a discussion of conjunction and disjunction in perception, and again we have an area where some discussion of multisensory interaction, which would seem to be the best-case examples of conjunction and disjunction operations performed by perception, would be welcome. Awareness of sound sources would seem to be a kind of conjunction, for instance, where our visual and auditory systems coordinate on a single target as the source of a particular sound.

The final Chapter 9 examines the epistemology of perception. Here Hill defends an externalist account of epistemic justification for perception. There is an interesting discussion of the familiar debates between internalist and externalist approaches to epistemic justification, and the chapter ends with a discussion of skepticism and replies to objections.

Overall, the picture presented by Hill is compelling and always interesting. One general concern is that, despite admonishing philosophers for their overreliance on intuitions and introspection, Hill himself makes use of arguments from intuition throughout the book. By my count, the phrase “reflection shows” followed by a substantive theoretical claim occurs 23 times in the book. I always worry about reliance on intuition and introspection, but there is an increased tension in this book, since Hill’s own conception of perception (and its introspection) takes it to be so strongly integrated with downstream motoric and cognitive elements that we could never sort them apart from the inside:

When a perceptual experience occurs, it immediately triggers post-experiential representations in the upper levels of the relevant perceptual system, and its influence then rapidly spreads to parts of the brain that house conceptual representations. Once these representations have been activated, they can combine with purely experiential representations to guide cognition and action. (220)

These fused experiences are often invisible to introspection:

[P]erceptual experiences are often bound to singular concepts so closely that introspection cannot discriminate between conceptual content and content that is purely experiential. (99)

And yet, elsewhere, he argues that introspection is reliable enough to know that cognition has nothing to do with our experience of color:

It is clear, however, that these cognitive states are not in any way part of the phenomenology of your experience of red, though they may have their own proprietary phenomenologies. From the perspective of introspection, the phenomenology associated with your experience of the red object is exhausted by the appearance of red that you are enjoying. Relations to cognitive states have nothing to do with it. (172)

It is difficult to reconcile these tensions.

In general, I would have preferred a bit more reliance on the empirical evidence, and from a wider swath of cases, than Hill provides here. If it is, as Hill seems to suggest, the more complex experiential representations, with elements from across our mental faculties, that actually guide cognition and action, then why rely on introspection or intuition to be a reliable guide to what turn out to be purely functional (or theoretical) boundaries? More importantly, why focus on just the perceptual contribution to this complex, if all the interesting work is being done by the complexes in which they interact?

These small quibbles aside, this is an impressive work, filled with more arguments and positions than I could hope to summarize in a short review. It presents a cohesive and attractive conception of perception that many will find compelling.


Many thanks to Jonathan Cohen and Murat Aydede for helpful comments on this review.


Aydede, Murat. 2018. A Contemporary Account of Sensory Pleasure, in Lisa Shapiro (ed.), Pleasure: A History, Oxford University Press. 239–266.

Kringelbach, M. L., & Berridge, K. C. (2009). Towards a functional neuroanatomy of pleasure and happiness. Trends in cognitive sciences, 13(11), 479–487.

Cohen, J. (2010). Perception and computation. Philosophical Issues, 20, 96–124.

Corns, J. (2014). Unpleasantness, motivational oomph, and painfulness. Mind & Language, 29(2), 238–254.

Helm, B. W. (2002). Felt evaluations: A theory of pleasure and pain. American Philosophical Quarterly, 39(1), 13–30.

Jacobson, H. (2019). Not only a messenger: towards an attitudinal‐representational theory of pain. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 99(2), 382–408.

Neander, K. (2017). A mark of the mental: In defense of informational teleosemantics. MIT Press.

Shea, N. (2018). Representation in cognitive science. Oxford University Press.