Perfect Me: Beauty as an Ethical Ideal

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Heather WiddowsPerfect Me: Beauty as an Ethical Ideal, Princeton University Press, 2018, 341pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691160078

Reviewed by Samantha Brennan, University of Guelph


Heather Widdows argues in this book that the beauty ideal is changing, from an aesthetic ideal to an ethical one. She maintains that the ethical ideal of beauty is becoming more prominent and increasingly global and that in order to understand the strength and scope of the beauty ideal we need to understand the construction of selves under that ideal. Widdows argues also that we do not choose our beauty ideals as individuals, that they are imposed on us collectively.

An obvious point of comparison is Naomi Wolf's The Beauty Myth: How Images of Beauty Are Used Against Women (1990)While they cover similar themes, Widdows' is more current, more sophisticated, and philosophically more rigorous. It also focuses on the specifically moral demands imposed by the beauty ideal. In the end though, I was as frustrated with its gaps as I was impressed by its argumentative arc. I'll say more later about what I felt was missing.

The book's first chapter sets out the main claim, that beauty is an ethical ideal. What does it mean for beauty to be an ethical ideal? The most obvious alternative is for it to be a purely aesthetic or purely prudential ideal. It's not purely either of those things and neither is the beauty ideal merely a social norm or personal aspiration, according to Widdows. She thinks it's clear that beauty is functioning as an ethical ideal when we look at what it means to fail in this area of life. Beauty failures are a kind of moral vice, a failure of the self. Widdows is right that we use moral language when it comes to beauty. She gives the example of being urged "to be your best self" or alternately being warned against "letting oneself go." The language of shame attaches to all areas of appearance, from shame over particular body parts to fat shaming. Negative moral properties such as stupid, lazy, and slow are associated with fatness. Positive moral traits such as being disciplined or hard working are associated with slimness. There are also rewards associated with attaining the beauty ideal, both in terms of material and relational goods. Widdows notes that this assumes that bodies are malleable and that with enough hard work and discipline that beauty is attainable for all.

Chapters 2 and 3 argue that beauty has become a more important moral value than in the past and that that ideal extends across the globe. Chapter 4 is also about the spread of beauty rituals from the rare and occasional to the expected and the routine. Chapter 5 takes up the topic of more extreme beauty practises. Chapter 6 looks at the costs and pleasures associated with the beauty ideal. Chapter 7 talks about the constitution of selves under the beauty ideal. Chapter 8 explores objectification. Chapter 9 offers an account of the limits of the liberal choice model. Chapter 10 critically explores the claim that beauty practises are for men's benefit.

I think Widdows is right that attempts to address the beauty ideal must recognise its strong attraction and the pleasure in its pursuit. She's also right that pursuit of beauty has become normalized so that the line between what's normal and perfection has blurred. Certainly she's right that the demands of beauty have increased in scope. Is anyone off the hook? There seems to me no age at which women can stop caring about looks without judgement. It starts young and never ends. Women are supposed to "get their bodies back" within weeks of giving birth, for example. There's no activity which is off the hook either. Consider the case of sports make up, special sweat proof cosmetics that allow you to look beautiful at the gym or while running a marathon. There are significant costs to those who pursue beauty as an ideal. Widdows considers the harms of eating disorders and botched cosmetic surgery. But there are also costs to those who provide beauty services such as the health risks to those who work in nail salons.

I think Widdows deserves high praise for her interdisciplinary work in this book and its combination with philosophical rigor. Although her main thesis is an ethical one, I think that the philosophical heavy lifting in it is in largely the area of aesthetics. For example, Widdows details what counts as minimal routine beauty maintenance, and what goes above and beyond and is only necessary on an occasional basis (99). Next up in terms of philosophical significance is Widdows' account of the construction of the self under the beauty ideal (Chapters 7-9). It's not simply that there are liberal selves who weigh the advantages and disadvantages and choose to adopt the beauty ideal. Instead selves are constructed through the ideal and its pursuit. Widdows argues that our sense of self is changing with the rise and spread of the beauty ideal. For better or worse, we at one time thought of our bodies as mere covers and our selves the book underneath. Instead we've come to associate the self with the body. We pin our future selves on the beautiful more perfect bodies we hope to become.

There is an awful lot of analysis of the content of the beauty ideal, but less about the details of the ethical demands that follow from the ideal. Are we ethically required to maximize our attainment of the ideal? That can't be right. Many women are criticized for paying too much attention to beauty. It's supposed to happen naturally, without effort and striving. How about beauty as one value among many -- work achievement, friends, family, health and so on -- and we are required to meet a certain minimal beauty standard? That seems more reasonable, but I am not sure where Widdows stands. Are there any rights that follow from the beauty ideal? What about responsibilities and obligations?

Likewise, is beauty an agent-neutral good? Am I required to care as much about the beauty of distant others as I do about my own beauty and that of nearby loved ones? If ethics is divided into the right and the good, then the book's focus is clearly on the latter.

Of course, men and women do not experience the normative demands of the beauty ideal equally, and another weakness of the book is its failure to engage with structures of power, privilege, and domination. In Chapter 10, Widdows rejects the feminist analysis of beauty rituals as exploitation by men. I agreed with some of Widdows' criticisms of the usual feminist analysis of beauty, but I would have liked to have read more about her alternative view.

The strongest parts of the book are the arguments about beauty becoming an ethical, as opposed to merely aesthetic, ideal. Its weakest point is the lack of argument about the political structures that prop up such demands and the connection between beauty as a good and what is required as right action. I suspect ethicists will worry about the connection between beauty and ethical ideals. Feminists will worry about the political plan required to dismantle the beauty ideal. Feminist ethicists might find that this book strikes the right balance between moral theorizing and the claims feminists want to make about the demands on women.