Perfecting Virtue: New Essays on Kantian Ethics and Virtue Ethics

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Lawrence Jost and Julian Wuerth (eds.), Perfecting Virtue: New Essays on Kantian Ethics and Virtue Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 308pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521515252.

Reviewed by Margo Landy, San Francisco State University


This book consists of a series of essays on virtue ethics and Kantian ethics. It purports to explore and to go some way toward resolving the conflicts between Kantian ethics and virtue ethics: "The twelve newly commissioned essays in this volume, by leading scholars in both traditions, explore key aspects of each approach as related to the debate, and identify new common ground but also real and lasting differences between these approaches" (back cover). The contributors are indeed leading scholars in ethics – they include some of the most recognizable names in either sub-field.

Any collection of essays on a theme faces a tension: the individual essays can be interesting and productive in their own terms, or they can contribute to the larger theme. But for the most part, a collection will fall somewhere between the two.

This collection inclines toward the former side: the individual essays each tackle interesting issues related to virtue ethics and Kantian ethics, but are more interesting in their own right than they are as contributions to the larger theme. For the most part, each of these papers falls either on the Kantian side or on the virtue ethics side, and few of the authors seem to be making a good-faith effort at resolving conflicts between the two. Rather, they seem to be further entrenching themselves into the positions from which they began.

Rather than summarize each paper (a summary can be found in the introduction to the volume), I will trace one of the few themes that surfaces throughout the essays and that seems to be at the heart of the disagreements between the two camps. This is the question of the codifiability thesis: whether morality, or moral knowledge, is or can be codified into moral principles. This question is most explicitly taken up by Rosalind Hursthouse's paper, "What does the Aristotelean phronimos know?," and resurfaces at points throughout the book.

Hursthouse's essay considers the question of what, for Aristotle, moral knowledge is. Specifically, what the phronimos (or practically wise man) has in phronesis, his moral knowledge. Her answer is that "What the phronimos is excellent at because of his phronesis is practical reasoning" (38). The main thrust of her argument is that, for Aristotle, what the phronimos does not have is codified knowledge. Her argument relies on a textual analysis, which is very interesting, even for those with only moderate familiarity with the texts.

So what we have so far is the beginnings of an account -- far from complete, but quite substantial -- of the phronimos' special knowledge, which emphasizes not his knowledge of a code of action-guiding rules, but his mastery of a large number of concepts, a mastery he displays in applying them correctly, case by case. (46)

Here, however, I will not focus on her argument, but on its implications for Kantian ethics. Hursthouse writes as if codifiability is an epistemological (as opposed to an ontological) question. Her entire discussion is centered around what the phronimos knows, and in what moral knowledge consists. For example, she writes, "No Aristotelian should believe that there is something, say a set of definitions, that someone who lacked virtue could, in theory, use to work out, reliably, whether something was important" (53).

The ontological question, by contrast, is whether there really is such a code of principles, according to which right actions are right and wrong actions are wrong. Someone (perhaps the phronimos) may have reliable judgments about what is right or wrong without using such a code. But that is to say nothing about whether there is such an underlying code. And the problem for Hursthouse, I would argue, is that if her conclusion concerns the epistemological point, then it is difficult to understand how this is meant to be a challenge to a Kantian ethicist. The Kantian can grant the point that a person might be able to discriminate morally good from morally evil acts without having any access to a codified set of rules that describe the principles that make such acts good and evil, and yet still maintain that there is such a set of principles and that these are what gives such actions their moral worth. I should note that Hursthouse does not explicitly take Kantians as her opponent, although given the subject of the book it is difficult to read her any other way.

This thread is next brought up in Barbara Herman's paper, "The difference that ends make." This, too, is a fascinating paper, and actually its main subject is not the codifiability thesis. Its main subject is the formula of humanity and rational nature.  Herman argues that the end of humanity is important for understanding the universal law formulation:

So when we make use of the humanity of another, we ought to be able to regard our maxim as one that could be co-willed by each of us. This is not to say that each must have an equal interest in the purpose of the action. Rather, the principle of action must be one that each can judge to be valid on the same rational grounds, and our maxim, our principle of action, should acknowledge and accept the conditions of co-willing. (110)

That in itself is neither here nor there for the purposes of the codifiability thread. But in an intriguing aside, Herman writes,

For example, proponents of the non-codifiability thesis (and its particularist descendants) resist the very idea of general duties and obligation. But, one might wonder, is the thought really that the fit of human purposes and norms with the world is such that we cannot say in advance and for similar cases that "this" must be done, or even done in such and such circumstances? (92-3)

What Herman seems to have in mind here is what I above referred to as the ontological version of the codifiability thesis: that morality consists in some codifiable set of rules and principles. Although Herman also uses the idiom of "knowing in advance" clearly her suggestion here concerns the nature of morality itself, not our knowledge of it.

Talbot Brewer, in his essay "Two pictures of practical thinking," offers another contribution touching on this central issue. Brewer criticizes Kant on the grounds that Kant is focused on a specific case of practical thinking: what to do in a moment in time. Brewer argues for a more "Aristotelian" position, that practical thinking is temporally extended:

For the Kantian, the moral quality of our practical reasoning is entirely a matter of the content and provenance of the maxims on which we act. The practical thinking that matters, morally speaking, begins from a morally innocent description of our circumstances and culminates in a verdict about what to do in those circumstances. To complete such an episode of thought just is to adopt a maxim counting said circumstances as sufficient reason for the type of action upon which one has settled. . . . This Kantian conception of practical reasoning cannot properly accommodate the sort of thinking through which we monitor our own unfolding activities and discern the highest possibilities latent in them. (144)

Brewer seems to understand Kant as proposing the categorical imperative as providing a description of our everyday practical reasoning, rather than as the principle underlying moral normativity itself. As Herman points out, this is a dangerous mistake. "In thinking about the role of moral rules and principles, one should be careful not to conflate the forms of practical activity with whatever gives them authority or justification" (93). While Brewer is not subject to the same confusion as Hursthouse, his understanding of the role of the categorical imperative is closely related. Rather than focusing on what makes something moral or immoral, his focus is on our forms of practical reasoning, the means that we employ to discern such truths.

It is possible that the Aristotelians' focus here on the epistemology of morality rather than on its ontology is a principled part of their virtue theories, but if so, that issue is something that could have been more productively discussed by some of the authors in this volume.

Again, the importance of the contributors along with the generally high quality of their contributions make this a volume worth reading for anybody working on Kantian ethics, virtue ethics, and especially their intersections.