Perfection and Disharmony in the Thought of Jean-Jacques Rousseau

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Jonathan Marks, Perfection and Disharmony in the Thought of Jean-Jacques Rousseau, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 200pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 052185069X.

Reviewed by Timothy O'Hagan, University of East Anglia


This book started its life as a PhD thesis in political theory and it bears the marks of its origin on every page. It is a brief, dense text, focused on a specific problem within Rousseau's work and on an equally specific set of commentaries.

Marks claims that "Rousseau's thought is a reflection on the natural perfection of naturally disharmonious man". In expounding this interpretation of Rousseau, Marks concentrates on three of his texts, the Discourse on the Origin of Inequality among Men (the Second Discourse), the Social Contract, and the Emile. This is a sound choice.

The book consists of a substantial Introduction and a brief Conclusion flanking four chapters, entitled (1) "Natural perfection"; (2) "The savage pattern"; (3) "Rousseau's rhetorical strategy"; (4) "Rousseau and Charles Taylor".

Marks's exegetical task is to show that, according to Rousseau, [a] "nature itself is a source of disharmony" and [b] human beings are endowed with "natural perfection". But [c] disharmony is an imperfection. Therefore [a] and [b] must be inconsistent. Marks's solution is to show that although [c] appears to be a recurring theme of Rousseau's thought, it does not represent his deepest insight into the human condition.

Marks extracts from each of the chosen texts the thesis of man's natural disharmony. Thus, in the Second Discourse, the forest of the pure state of nature is found to be not the idyllic setting for the harmonious savage, since it does not offer an environment of absolute plenty, but requires its inhabitants to engage in some foresight and planning to store up food against times of shortage. That in turn means that reflection and deferred satisfaction, which would be absent if natural man were wholly unitary, turn out to be present ab initio. So division is both natural and the source of disharmony, which means that man is destined to "a life that oscillates". As Marks understands them, most commentators have mistakenly read the first book of the Emile as a statement that the modern world is an unsatisfactory compromise between polar opposites, between the natural and the social, between man and citizen; a compromise which can be resolved only by opting unreservedly for one or other of the two alternatives. Since there can be no return to the Forest or pure state of nature, this leaves us with the unappetizing prospect of political collectivism, in which the individual is totally absorbed into the body of the sovereign people. Marks finds a more attractive model in the developmental psychology of the Emile, already adumbrated in Part II of the Second Discourse, in which our divided nature is to be managed, not suppressed.

The question remains however why Rousseau so frequently condemned internal disharmony in absolute terms. Marks's answer is that the society in which Rousseau found himself was a bourgeois society; he was in fact critical not of disharmony as such, but only of disharmony as it displayed itself in the life of the bourgeois. Rousseau's apparently absolute condemnation of disharmony is to be explained by the fact that bourgeois values were so prevalent in his society that he was tempted to draw a general conclusion from contemporary French society, even though the logic of his own theory precluded any such inference.

I shall return to the figure of the bourgeois in a moment. But first I shall complete my overview of the author's strategy. Marks explains, or explains away, Rousseau's recurring use of bipolar, either/or models in a subtle and interesting fashion. On the one hand, the present world is dominated by the bourgeois and in such a world there is no space where human beings might flourish in the envisaged way, marked by profound divisions within their souls, while at the same time both acting autonomously and relating more or less successfully to others.

But it still remains true that Rousseau often suggested that this envisaged world is not simply different from our present one, but rather logically impossible. Marks responds that Rousseau engaged in a series of "rhetorical strategies", writing against a dominant ideology of Enlightenment optimism, according to which we are already members of a happy world of rational, cooperative individualists each of whose self-seeking behaviour sums to an aggregate benefit. Rousseau, rightly skeptical of optimism, was drawn to exaggerate the difficulty of ever finding a media via between total absorption of the individual in the social whole and total isolation of the individual either in the forest of pre-social man or in the self-imposed exile of post-social man. That a compromise is possible is demonstrated by the figures of Emile on the one hand and of the envisaged citizens of Poland and Corsica on the other.

This brings us back to the bourgeois. Marks uses the term repeatedly without feeling the need to explain it. My guess is that he is following Allen Bloom, who wrote: "Rousseau is the first writer to use the word bourgeois in the modern sense popularized by Marx, [who] defined [it] in opposition to citizen …". Bloom was here commenting on a passage in Emile Book I: "He who in the civil order wants to preserve the primacy of the sentiments of nature does not know what he wants. Always in contradiction with himself, always floating between his inclinations and his duties, he will never be either man or citizen. He will be good neither for himself nor for others. He will be one of those men of our days: a Frenchman, an Englishman, a bourgeois". As far as I know, this is Rousseau's only criticism of the bourgeois.

Elsewhere, in a footnote to the word cité at Social Contract I.6, Rousseau wrote: "The true meaning of this word has been almost completely obliterated among the moderns; most of them take a town (ville) for a city (cité) and a bourgeois for a citizen. They do not understand that while houses make the town, citizens make the city." Rousseau went on to criticize Bodin for conflating the two terms, and to praise d'Alembert for being the only Frenchman to have distinguished them. To be a bourgeois, a resident (or "townsman" in Bondanella's translation) was a necessary, but not sufficient, condition for full Genevan citizenship. Rousseau generalized that distinction to conclude that active participation by its citizens is a criterion of a legitimate political order. In itself this does not involve any negative judgment of the bourgeois. Like "the men of our days", Bodin reduced citizenship to mere residence, ignoring participation. That seems to be the limit of Rousseau's criticism of the bourgeois.

Of course it does not matter for Marks whether Rousseau meant something quite different by bourgeois from what the twenty-first century political theorist means by it. The latter, he might respond, enjoys the benefits of hindsight and has a superior theory of social classes. Now if that is his response, it calls for at least a sketch of the theory in question; yet Marks provides none. One must assume that he would have little sympathy for traditional Marxist theory. According to it, classes are determined by relations of power over the means of production, so that the two essential classes of capitalism are bourgeoisie and proletariat, owners and non-owners of capital respectively. Survivors from a previous era are what Marx and Engels called the petty bourgeois: artisans and peasants existing on the margins of the ever more dominant bipolar structure of capitalism. Insofar as they are doomed to the dustbin of history, their spokesmen, including Rousseau, are dismissed as past their sell-by date. Those who wish to disentangle a coherent theory of the class structure from a disastrous historicist myth will find in Rousseau a principled, systematic defender of the values of the petty bourgeois, self-subsistent, frugal and resistant to dépendance personnelle.

The undefined bourgeois brings us to the last chapter of the book, in which Marks compares Rousseau and Charles Taylor. Here the bourgeois is neither the inhabitant of the bourg, the potential free citizen, nor the agent of a productive system with its own inexorable logic. Instead the Marksian (rather than Marxian) bourgeois performs in a play written by recent political theory, entitled "The Great Struggle between Liberals and Communitarians". In its script, the bourgeois appears as the caricature liberal, the one incorrectly ascribed by Sandel to Rawls, the unhappy, unattached individual who still haunts communitarian images of liberalism despite the best efforts of Amy Gutmann and others to rebut them.

Marks however is far too sophisticated to fall for such simplistic errors, and the same is true of his target in this chapter, Charles Taylor. According to Marks, Taylor, in seeking a middle ground between the two camps, finds some promising signs in Rousseau, but rejects the latter's solution on the grounds that he fails to allow room for individual authenticity, which he finally sacrifices to the demands of the community. On the contrary, says Marks, Taylor "makes peace at too high a cost", since he, a typical post-modernist, rejects any recourse to nature as a standard transcending any particular society, and so leaves the "individual more dependent on the community than Rousseau does". The standard which Rousseau derived from nature is the "sentiment of existence". Because he is in possession of this elusive but powerful idea, Rousseau, unlike Taylor, could pass between the Scylla of total absorption and the Charybdis of total isolation. The hero of Rousseau's story, we are told, "succeeds in combining the goods the bourgeois so unsuccessfully failed to combine". Taylor's mistake is to take Rousseau as "an all-or-nothing thinker", whereas Marks's Rousseau allows for a troubled disequilibrium deep in the human heart which, far from being destructive, is the source of vitality and progress.

In short, Perfection and Disharmony is a maddening but rewarding book. It is maddening because the reader may prefer to cut to the chase, rather than meander through the by-ways of recent political theory. It is rewarding because its dénouement is original and provocative. If you had come to the conclusion that nothing more could be squeezed out of Rousseau's very familiar texts, then Marks's book should make you think again. It reminds us that the riches of Jean-Jacques' œuvre are inexhaustible.