Perfectionism and the Common Good: Themes in the Philosophy of T.H. Green & Prolegomena to Ethics

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David O. Brink, Perfectionism and the Common Good: Themes in the Philosophy of T. H. Green, Oxford University Press, 2003, 160pp., $27.50 (hbk), ISBN 0199266409.

T. H. Green, Prolegomena to Ethics, David O. Brink (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2003, 632pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199266433.

Reviewed by Bart Schultz, University of Chicago


David Brink's philosophical career would seem to have taken some intriguing turns. His earlier work, notably Moral Realism and the Foundations of Ethics (Cambridge, 1989), was very much in the mode of current analytical metaethics, resisting any Rawlsian insouciance about the importance of metaethics in developing substantive ethical theory. Insofar as he adumbrated a substantive ethical view in this book, it was by way of suggesting how "Objective Utilitarianism" would be an excellent candidate for fitting the moral realist program that he had laid out. The "Cornell realism" of Boyd, Sturgeon, and Irwin was felt at many points in Moral Realism -- understandably so, since it was a re-working of Brink's Cornell doctoral thesis. Much ingenuity was shown in arguing that "the practical or action-guiding character of morality supports moral realism . . . and moral realism's practical implications seem superior to those of many antirealist theories" (Moral Realism, p. 211). And much effort was expended in demonstrating how moral realism, "like other kinds of realism, can and should be combined with a coherence view of justification," rather than linked to the familiar forms of foundationalism, including rational intuitionism (Moral Realism, p. 211).


But Brink, like certain of his mentors, has always had strong historical interests as well, and he has published influential articles on Aristotle, Mill, Sidgwick, and other leading figures in the history of moral theory. As his homepage explains, his approach to "foundational questions about practical reason, moral demands, and the normativity of ethics" involves blending "historical concern with the views of important figures and traditions in the history of ethics and systematic concern with the clearest and most plausible formulations of ethical issues and their resolution." Much of his more historical work has been especially attuned to the metaethical thinking of the classical utilitarians, though always with an eye to their broader ethical positions. Thus, he has had some long, hard, and insightful struggles with Sidgwick's intuitionism and Mill's deliberative reason, not to mention Parfit's work on personal identity and utilitarianism. If he has consistently found Sidgwick's intuitionism hard to swallow, he has at least also found in it a clear recognition of the importance of metaethics to ethics, which was more than one could find in Rawls, whose metaethical anti-realism was, according to Brink, misguidedly kept hidden in the closet. And of course, Brink has in good analytical fashion often worked in a more piecemeal way on particular problems-friendship, character, personal identity, and many others, making some noteworthy contributions to analytical jurisprudence as well.

As an intellectual trajectory, Brink's work has thus seemingly fallen together rather nicely, appearing as a concerted effort to rehabilitate utilitarianism in large part through rehabilitating its metaethics and metaethics generally. He has urged, for example, that Mill can be helpfully read as an objectivist about value and Sidgwick as an externalist distinguishing the issue of moral truth from the motivating reasons for being moral, though he has often followed Sidgwick in addressing the challenge of rational egoism in various forms (see for example his "Sidgwick and the Rationale for Rational Egoism," B. Schultz, ed., Essays on Henry Sidgwick, Cambridge, 1992).

Given this previous fondness for the label "utilitarian," some might well think that, with this brace of new books, Brink has gone over to the other side, his Sidgwickian doubts leading him straight to the camp of Sidgwick's leading idealist rival, T. H. Green. What began as a noble but limited effort to get Green's main work back in print -- admittedly, not in a genuine scholarly edition, but only in an affordable one with a helpful up-to-date Introduction and Bibliographical Essay -- ended with Brink's drafts for an Introduction spiraling into a book of its own. Although his introduction to Green 's work "remains quite substantial in its treatment of the context, content, and significance of Green's ethical theory," Perfectionism and the Common Good "extends that discussion in various ways." Among other things, it "engages Green's texts more fully, and it examines several aspects of Green's ethical theory and his relation to other traditions in the history of ethics in greater detail" (Perfectionism, p. vi). Neither work provides a "comprehensive or definitive examination and assessment of Green's practical philosophy." Brink's aim is the more modest one of getting Green's work back into circulation and contributing ''to a re-examination of Green's ethical theory by reconstructing some of the main themes of the Prolegomena and beginning to assess his significance for the history of ethics and systematic ethical theory" (Perfectionism, p. vi). Still, one detects a very positive drift:

It is perhaps not unreasonable to treat Sidgwick as an early and influential representative of the sort of analytical ethical theory that now dominates Anglo-American moral philosophy. Sidgwick's failure to engage Green's Prolegomena sympathetically represents a missed opportunity within the analytic tradition for fruitful dialogue about the merits of a metaphysical approach to ethics and an interesting form of perfectionism. The comparative neglect of the Prolegomena over the last seventy years has certainly contributed to the neglect of such options within the analytic tradition. With the recent resurgence of interest in the history of philosophy generally, and the history of ethics in particular, now is an appropriate time to under-take a re-examination of the Prolegomena and Green's ethical theory. If we approach systematic ethics in the way Green himself did- by conscientious engagement with important traditions in the history of ethics-we will look to the Prolegomena not just as a significant work in the history of ethics but also as a work of enduring significance." (Perfectionism, pp. 123-24).

Indeed, for Brink, the call has gone out: Green's methodological blend of historical and systematic concerns, his conception of the justification, content, and implications of perfectionism, and his contributions to explaining the normativity of other-regarding moral demands are all aspects of his ethical theory that deserve careful attention and further scrutiny. More generally, I hope that this survey of the context, content, and implications of Green's Prolegomena suggests that it is a neglected classic in the history of ethics, comparable in significance to Bradley's Ethical Studies and Sidgwick's Methods of Ethics. (Perfectionism, p. 129). If he cannot quite bring himself to say that Green was right about most things (and Sidgwick wrong), he nonetheless now shows a marked fondness for the label "perfectionist" in place of "utilitarian."

But the appearances are deceiving. For one thing, Brink's deeper philosophical self has always had perfectionist tendencies. Even in Moral Realism, Green had received at least some mention, and Brink's use of the label "utilitarian" was carefully qualified and tentative. Thus: "Traditional versions of utilitarianism construe welfare as either pleasure or preference satisfaction. My own version of utilitarianism, however, relies on quite different claims about the nature of value and human welfare" (Moral Realism, p. 217). Hence the significance of the qualifier "Objective," as attached to his self-described utilitarianism: "OU claims that goodness is identical with a certain nonreductive, objective conception of human welfare and that rightness is identical with the maximization of welfare, so construed" (Moral Realism, p. 238). As Brink noted, "Most of the ancient Greeks (e.g., Homer, Plato, Aristotle, and the Stoics), Mill (on certain readings), and the British idealists (e.g., Green and Bradley) defend different versions of objectivism" (Moral Realism, p. 222). What is more, "My own view of how an objective conception of welfare underwrites an egoist account of the justifiability of morality's other-regarding demands might be compared with what I take to be similar views in Plato, Aristotle, Bradley, and Green" (Moral Realism, p. 244). This last point reflects Brink 's consistent defense of "externalism against internalism." The concept of morality shows neither that moral considerations motivate nor that they provide reasons for action. Whether a moral fact or its recognition motivates or provides reasons for action depends on a substantive theory of reasons for action, the content of morality, and various facts about agents and the world" (Moral Realism, p. 240). Of course, adducing egoistic reasons for doing the right thing does not unmask the "right thing" as nothing but a hypocritical cover for self-interest. Moral truth is still moral truth.

If Brink did, in Moral Realism, tend to urge that all this was consistent with naturalism, and that "the realist is better advised to defend ethical naturalism," he also allowed that a "nonnaturalist could accept something like OU. He could claim that moral facts and properties are neither identical with nor constituted by, but nonetheless weakly supervene on, natural and social scientific facts and properties that contribute to the realization of human welfare" (Moral Realism, p. 238). And he confessed his sympathy with other types of teleological theory with "nonmaximizing accounts of the relation between the right and the good" (Moral Realism, p. 214). Thus, the road to Green's idealist perfectionism was wide open, and in such essays as "Self-Love and Altruism," which appeared in 1997 in Social Philosophy & Policy, the stress is on:

An important philosophical tradition that insists that we ought to modify our pretheoretical understanding of self-interest on metaphysical grounds. According to this tradition, people's interests, properly understood, are metaphysically, and not just causally, interdependent such that acting on other-regarding moral requirements is a counterfactually reliable way for an agent to promote his own interests. Insofar as this sort of view rests on metaphysical claims about persons, we might call it metaphysical egoism. This sort of view is familiar from the Greek eudaemonist tradition, especially the work of Plato and Aristotle, and from the British idealist tradition, especially the work of T. H. Green. The version of metaphysical egoism that I find most promising draws on claims in these two traditions-in particular, Plato's discussions of love in the Symposium and the Phaedrus, Aristotle's discussions of friendship and political community in the Nicomachean Ethics . . .  and the Politics, and Green 's discussion of self-realization and the extension of the common good in the Prolegomena to Ethics. It develops these claims, in part, by appeal to some familiar, though not uncontroversial, claims about persons and personal identity. ("Altruism," p. 124).

Which brings us directly to the works under review, albeit with the lurking question of why Brink ever bothered with the term "utilitarian" to begin with.

Still, and this is another point at which appearances are rather deceiving, a case can be made that Brink's perfectionism really does owe much to the utilitarian thinkers, in part because, as he himself has discovered, utilitarianism from Mill to Moore has always had strong perfectionist elements, and in part because his sympathies for Green's work are colored throughout by insights and qualms derived directly from Sidgwick, not that this is adequately acknowledged. As the previously quoted passage suggests, Brink prefers to use Sidgwick as a foil for bringing out the merits of Green. There is ample and erudite precedent for this gambit, notably in the work of Irwin (see his influential essay, "Eminent Victorians and Greek Ethics: Sidgwick, Green, and Aristotle," in B. Schultz, ed., Essays on Henry Sidgwick). But too often, he makes Sidgwick's critique of Green sound like mere hostile criticism from the outside, and this is unfair. For Sidgwick, as for Brink, ethical theory still had much progress to make, and other varieties of teleological theory, including perfectionism, remained possibilities worth investigating. Thus, as Thomas Hurka has argued, Hastings Rashdall developed a very plausible (and nonegoistic) version of perfectionism that he in effect deemed a further effort in Sidgwick's overall research project (see especially, "Moore in the Middle," Ethics 113 [2003]). Much the same could be said of G. E. Moore, as Hurka claims, though Moore's anti­ idealist form of ideal utilitarianism receives only passing mention in these works. For all of his (considerable) doubts about such alternatives, Sidgwick took such possibilities very seriously and simply refused to close the book on them (see, for instance, "Some Fundamental Ethical Controversies," reprinted in Marcus Singer, ed., Henry Sidgwick: Essays on Ethics and Method, Oxford, 2000).

To be sure, he took some approaches to be more plausible than others. But Green's was one that he took very seriously indeed. Green, who died at the tragically young age of 45, had been a Rugby schoolmate of Sidgwick's, but he went on to study with Jowett at Balliol College, Oxford, and to become the first layman to be appointed a tutor at Oxford, in due course being appointed Whyte's Professor of Moral Philosophy, in 1877. Unlike Sidgwick, Green was an inspiring teacher who attracted students in large numbers; like Sidgwick, he was an active reformer who helped shape the "New Liberalism" of the late Victorian era. His philosophizing was very much an effort to bolster his evangelical religious faith, as demonstrated by Richter's valuable study, The Politics of Conscience: T. H Green and His Age (Cambridge, MA, 1964). His major work was his Prolegomena to Ethics, which appeared posthumously, edited by A. C. Bradley. During his lifetime, his philosophical reputation rested on, in addition to his teaching, his book-length introduction to the Longman's edition of the works of Hume that he edited with T. H. Grose and his hugely influential "Lecture on Liberal Legislation and Freedom of Contract." His other major work, Lectures on the Principles of Political Obligation, also appeared posthumously.

Green's Prolegomena can certainly be read, as Brink suggests, as the better idealist response to Sidgwick's Methods of Ethics, a less polemical more historically sophisticated development of the idealist case than F. H. Bradley's Ethical Studies, which appeared earlier. And he is of course right that Green's tragic premature death robbed the philosophical world of the great intellectual contest that would have come with continuing rounds of exchange between him and Sidgwick, who was philosophically active right up to the time of his death, in 1900. But it is difficult to make out how he can charge Sidgwick with failing to engage Green's views "sympathetically" when so many of the worries and qualifications that he himself voices can in fact be found in Sidgwick, who devoted an enormous amount of time, both personally and professionally, to coming to terms with Green's philosophical positions. As Sidgwick once explained,

I have been busy lately reviewing Green's posthumous book -- Prolegomena to Ethics. I read it twice over carefully: the first time much impressed with its ethical force and persuasiveness: the second time unable to resist the conviction that my intellect could not put it together into a coherent whole-in fact, that it would not do-and yet that probably it was better that young men should be believers in it than in anything I can teach them. This is a conviction adapted to make a Professor cynical" (quoted in Henry Sidgwick, A Memoir, E. M. Sidgwick and A. Sidgwick, Macmillan, eds., 1906, p. 380).

Sidgwick continued to read and review Green for the rest of his life, and his commentary on him appeared not only in later editions of the Methods, but also in various essays and reviews and the posthumous volumes Lectures on the Ethics of T. H. Green, Mr. Herbert Spencer, and J. Martineau (Macmillan, 1902) and Lectures on the Philosophy of Kant and Other Philosophical Lectures and Essays (Macmillan,1905), edited by E. E. Constance Jones and James Ward, respectively. The latter is a particularly important treatment covering Kantian transcendentalism and idealism, and it develops some points also adumbrated in Philosophy, Its Scope and Relations (Macmillan, 1902), which was also edited by Ward and one of Sidgwick's most polished posthumous works. Brink makes no mention of Lectures on the Philosophy of Kant and seems unaware of the full scope of Sidgwick's work on Green.

Perhaps it is for this reason that Brink paints the contrast between the two in exaggerated, overly sharp tones. At any rate, when Brink is struggling to give lucid summaries of Green's metaphysics and how he argues for idealism, he ends up sounding every bit as frustrated as Sidgwick, announcing that ''the content of idealism, its justification, and its role in his ethical theory are rather obscure and require reconstruction" (Perfectionism, p. 8). As the reconstruction has it:

Green appears to have four main aims in the first book of the Prolegomena. (I) He wants to reject the common-sense view, inherited from the empiricists, that knowledge can be analysed into two separable components- the deliverances of the sense and the operations of the understanding-in which what is given by nature is real and the contributions of the understanding are not . . . By contrast, Green wants to argue, there is no such things as deliverances of the senses that do not reflect operation of the understanding. Even the simplest experience, he thinks, presupposes relations to other elements of a self-conscious mind. (2) The attack on empiricism and atomism is supposed to support the idealist claim that in some sense nature is the product of the understanding.  Green's attack on empiricism is clearly indebted to Kant's claims in the Critique of Pure Reason, especially Kant's account of the synthetic unity of apperception in the Transcendental Analytic. But, in defending idealism, Green argues that Kant did not carry his idealist principles to their logical conclusion . . . he rejects the Kantian dualism of appearances and things-in-themselves . . . (3) In order for the idealist to distinguish between appearance and reality, it is necessary to posit an 'eternal' and 'unalterable' system of relations in a self-conscious corporate agent that includes the finite systems of relations contained in the self-conscious minds of individual agents . . . (4) Much of the first book of the Prolegomena is concerned with the role of self­ consciousness in the possibility of apparently discrete episodes of experience. But Green is also concerned with the role of self­ consciousness in knowledge. Knowledge requires more than acting on appearances; it involves assenting to true appearances for good reasons. This requires the ability to distance oneself from appearances and assess the evidence for appearances, especially their congruence with other elements of consciousness. This sort of epistemic responsibility requires self-consciousness." (Perfectionism, pp. 8-9)

Thus, Green, like both Sidgwick and Rawls, was profoundly influenced by Kant's critique of empiricism, but reluctant to follow Kant on other points, notably the noumenal realm and free will. For Green, Kantian dualism is empty: we "can have no conception of things-in-themselves" (Perfectionism, p. 14). But as Brink admits, it is not at all clear how successful Green was in distancing himself from Kant. Although Green appreciated the Kantian problematic, seeing that "the idealist, who denies a reality independent of appearances, seems unable to explain from whence appearances come or how they might be in error, apparently claiming that thinking makes it so" (Perfectionism, p. 13), he favored, ultimately, a solution that has struck a great many serious commentators as both incredible and simply a reassertion of his (besieged) religious faith in God. For Green, "objectivity requires a single, transhistorical (indeed, eternal) self-consciousness" -- that is, a "transhistorical corporate agent" -- which sounds like God traveling under an alias. Green's

main argument for this form of absolute idealism seems to be his concern with the possibility of error. Just as we must make room for the possibility of local error in an individual's conscious experience, so too we have to allow for the possibility of systematic error within an individual's conscious experience. But just as the idealist explains the possibility of local individual error against the background of larger patterns in the individual's experience, so too she must explain the possibility of systematic individual error against the background of some larger pattern of experience. In order to find a larger pattern of experience, we must go outside individual consciousness. But the experiences of other individuals cannot, as such, form part of a common and larger set of experiences. If the content and truth conditions of an individual's thoughts are dependent on the relations between those thoughts and other elements of his consciousness, then individuals, as such, would have incommensurable experiences and thoughts. We can block this relativistic conclusion if there is a singly transhistorical corporate mind of which particular finite minds are proper parts. For then there will be a common determinant of the content and truth conditions of the experiences and thoughts of different finite agents. Green's view seems to be that knowledge and, hence, in inquiry presuppose absolute idealism (Perfectionism, p. 18).

All of this was recognized by Sidgwick, who was probably more sympathetic to Green 's religious concerns than Brink, who allows that "Green's non-naturalism is problematic" and that such defenses of absolute idealism leave the silent skeptic untouched. Green's "metaphysical and epistemological arguments" here "seem to demand a single transcendent self-consciousness that is outside space and time," but "much of Green's ethics, political philosophy, and theology seems to treat the corporate spiritual principle as a transhistorical agent that is immanent in the lives of individual agents and progressive social institutions. Green must choose whether the Absolute is transcendent or immanent" (Perfectionism, p. 19). More particularly, despite his reservations about Kantian dualism, "Green is a non­ naturalist about the self, treating it as outside time and space." But he also

maintains that the self acts in time and is a proper subject of ascriptions of responsibility. It is hard to see how individual agents can be simultaneously immanent and transcendent. In fact, this makes his own view about freedom hard to distinguish from Kant's. Green's non-naturalism about the self threatens to reintroduce the very dualism for which he criticizes Kant. ( Perfectionism, p. 19)

This is an excellent point, well made by Sidgwick:

One of the things that I am most certain of is the unity of myself. Green says that (1) I am really two things, so disparate as an eternal consciousness out of time, and a function of an animal organism changing in time; and yet at the same time that (2) I am one indivisible reality contemplated from two different points of view. I submit that Green is bound to reconcile this contradiction, which he does not do by simply stating that both contradictory propositions are true. As it is, his doctrine is rather like the theological doctrine of the Athanasian Creed, only the Athanasian Creed does not profess to give an intelligible account of the mysteries it formulates (Lectures on the Philosophy of Kant, p. 247).

At a later point in the book, Brink notes some other, similar passages from Sidgwick's Lectures on the Ethics of T. H. Green, Mr. Herbert Spencer, and J. Martineau and suggests that the "right response for Green, it seems, is to insist that while the self may be independent of particular episodes of sense experience, it is not outside consciousness and is not outside space and time" (Perfectionism, p. 120). Perhaps that is the right response. If so, it is shame that Green not only failed to make it, but actually asserted the opposite.

This is but one of a number of instances where Brink is, apparently unwittingly, recapitulating points made by Sidgwick, with considerably less religious longing that the religious standpoint be defended. His reconstructed Green often falls in a very grey area that makes him sound unclearly decided.

Where, then, are the conflicts? Brink allows that Green's critique of utilitarianism was fairly obsessed with the falsity of psychological hedonism, and that no such charge could be leveled against Sidgwick, who, as Green recognized, shared his Butlerian rejection of that view. Sidgwick did defend a (complex) form of evaluative hedonism, though, contra Brink, he did not claim that this was on a par with such apparently self-evident principles as the irrationality of a purely temporal preference for a nearer lesser good over a future greater good. Brink claims that Sidgwick's hedonism was only weakly defended: "Sidgwick says nothing about why we have reason to care about pleasure" (Perfectionism, p. 118). But Sidgwick was not terribly pleased with the view either; he only claimed it was less unsatisfactory than the alternatives and had an advantage over Green's notion of self-realization in being, as Brink puts it, "a clear and more definite end" allowing for greater practical guidance. Brink allows that that criticism troubled Green, who sometimes adopted Bradley's tactic of denying the importance of practical guidance. But Brink does not care for that tactic at all, and holds that Green's better angels came forth when he took a different line, arguing "that this assessment overestimates the determinacy of utilitarian calculations .  .  .  and underestimates the guidance provided by self-realization" (Perfectionism, p. 119). One of Brink's main aims is to play up how Green's "own liberal reforms in the franchise, labour regulations, and education were plausible examples of the sort of practical guidance that perfectionist principles can provide" (Perfectionism, p. 19). But once again, the contrasts are over-drawn. Sidgwick was also an academic liberal and shared many of Green's reformist concerns, providing good utilitarian arguments for them while spotting the fishiness of Green's practical ethics. However, Sidgwick was as sensitive as anyone to the limitations and indeterminacies of such utilitarian arguments. As he once put it to his friend H. G. Dakyns,

I think that with great trouble one may come to calculate the sources of such happiness as may then be found to be nearly valueless to us. Or better, in the development of human nature, the incalculable element increases at a more rapid ratio than the calculable, so that though the latter is always increasing it is (after a certain advance in intellect) always getting comparatively less" (quoted in B. Schultz, Henry Sidgwick, Eye of the Universe, Cambridge, 2004, p. 148).

Still, there are differences. In some respects, these come out more clearly earlier on in Perfectionism and the Common Good, when Brink addresses an issue obviously quite dear to his heart: "If Green's main complaints about utilitarianism are really complaints about hedonism, then he may have no objection to utilitarianism, as such. Much of Green's own ethical theory might plausibly be interpreted as reflecting a perfectionist form of utilitarianism" (Perfectionism, p. 75). Is it really so clear that "Green wants to reject utilitarianism or consequentialism as such"? (Perfectionism, p. 75).

But there are, for Brink, two objections to carrying the reconstruction that far towards his earlier self. In the first place,

Green's utilitarianism, on this reading, is a derived, rather than ultimate, commitment. For he is a utilitarian in so far as this is compatible with his interpretation of the common good, but the common good, as I understand it, is itself an ingredient in the more basic demand for self- realization" (Perfectionism, p. 75).

And in the second place, there is the steamy matter of impartiality. Utilitarianism is "doubly impartial," insisting on both "the wide scope of moral concern, "extending to all sentient creatures, and the assignment of "equal weight to everyone's good" (Perfectionism, p. 76). However,

Green seems ambivalent about this second sort of impartiality. Sometimes he seems to endorse the demands of equal concern. But we also saw that his argument for claiming that the common good is a central ingredient of self-realization requires him to claim that an agent's concern for others should be proportional to the strength of the associational ties that bind them. We said that this justification of the common good under-writes moral concern of universal scope but variable weight, of the sort embodied in self­ referential altruism. But self-referential altruism embodies · partiality at a deep level that is incompatible with the utilitarian conception of impartiality that requires equal concern.

We can see this point in terms of the distinction that some have drawn between agent-neutral and agent-relative reasons. The general form of agent-relative reasons makes essential reference to the agent in some way, whereas the general form of agent-neutral reasons does not. Utilitarianism is an agent-neutral form of consequentialism, because it says that an agent has the same reason to be concerned about anyone independently of the relationship in which he stands to that person. By contrast, both Green's ethics of self-realization and self-referential altruism are agent-relative in so far as they claim that an agent's reasons to be concerned about someone depend essentially on the nature of the relationship that exists between the agent and that person.

If so, then even if much of Green's perfectionist critique of hedonistic utilitarianism is compatible with a perfectionist utilitarianism, there are important strands in his conception and justification of the common good that do not admit of utilitarian interpretation (Perfectionism, pp. 76-77).

Just how to interpret Green on such questions, covering the tricky topics of  "desire, intellect, and will," has been the subject of some excellent work by John Skorupski (see especially his essay "Desire and Will in Sidgwick and Green," Utilitas, 12, 2000), to which, bafflingly, Brink makes no reference, even in his Bibliographical Essay.

At any rate, this set of issues quickly leads into another set, that involving the provocative thesis of the "Extreme Harmony of Interests" -- that is, Green's political and metaphysical conviction that ultimately one's own good must be understood in terms of the common good, such that working for the common good is the road to self-realization and cannot involve any genuine self-sacrifice. Ultimately, the good is noncompetitive.

This was another aspect of Green's work of keen interest to Sidgwick, who found the argument very hard to make out. He charged Green with being ambiguous "about whether the good is (l) the satisfaction of reflective or self-conscious desire or (2) perfection understood as the exercise of one's rational capacities" (Perfectionism, p. 121). Although Sidgwick failed to grasp how Green coherently moved from the first to the second, he did appreciate that the second was "Green's considered view." But this goal of perfection was in tum "ambiguous between (a) the exercise of the full range of an individual's rational capacities and (b) the exercise of specifically moral capacities connected with the common good. Sidgwick thinks that Green's waffling between (a) and (b) explains his vacillation about whether the virtuous person is really self-sacrificing or not" (Perfectionism, p. 122).

That is,

If perfection involves only moral capacities -- (b)-perfection -- then it is hard to see how morality could demand genuine self-sacrifice. However, morality might demand genuine self-sacrifice if the agent's perfection includes the exercise of various rational capacities, not just moral ones, that is, (a)-perfection. Sidgwick clearly thinks that Green could be entitled at most to the broader notion of perfection, (a) perfection. For this reason, Sidgwick think that despite all Green's talk about a common, non-competitive good, he cannot really avoid recognizing his own dualism of practical reason between perfection of the agent and perfection of others (Perfectionism, p. 122).

Brink's take on this is revealing. He deems Sidgwick's criticism "unwarranted in so far as it assumes that the perfection of the individual's own rational capacities and the perfection of others are unrelated ends" since "Green argues that pursuit of a permanent good must aim at forms of interpersonal association in which one values the good of associates for its own sake" (Perfectionism, p. 122). If (b)-perfection is part of (a)-perfection in this way, then "Green's considered view must be that any sacrifices that morality makes agents undergo are fully compensated sacrifices, just as intrapersonal sacrifices during one period within a life can be compensated for by greater gains later" (Perfectionism, p. 122). There is still such a thing as self-sacrifice, though it may be revealed as compensated or simply merely apparent, once one recognizes one's true interests.

Sidgwick, no more than Mill, would scarcely have claimed that a person's good is wholly unrelated to the good of others. But leaving that issue aside, what is revealing is the next point Brink makes, which concerns Green's claims for an extreme harmony of interests:

Even if the perfection of others forms a distinct and distinctively valuable part of my own perfection, it does not exhaust my own perfection. The opportunity cost of attending to the other-regarding aspects of my own perfection is the lost opportunity to contribute to more self-confined aspects of my own perfection. If so, Sidgwick is right to say that (a)-perfection and (b)-perfection are distinct, even if they are not independent. But then many sacrifices that the perfection of others demands will be genuine, and not all of them will be fully compensable. And this is enough to raise the spectre that there will be a kind of dualism of practical reason, not exactly between self and others, but between self-confined and other-regarding aspects of one's own perfection. (Perfectionism, p. 123)

Summarily put: Sidgwick was right and Green's position was a haze of spiritual uplift. For after all, Sidgwick's Methods was only very qualifiedly utilitarian and had actually argued that there was a fundamental dualism of the practical reason, a philosophical draw between rational egoism and utilitarianism. Brink thinks that the question remains "whether it is better to think of the conflict between self and others in hedonistic terms, as Sidgwick does, or in perfectionist terms, as Green does," but in fact Sidgwick thought of it in just this way, as a conflict manifesting itself under a number of different interpretations of ultimate good. And the question does remain a good one to this day, even if one agrees with Brink, as Sidgwick surely would have, that "Green may not be able to avoid entirely some version of Sidgwick 's dualism, but his attempts to overcome that dualism provide a distinctive and valuable contribution to debates about the authority of morality" (Perfectionism, p. 129).

For the reasons sketched in this review, it is arguable that Sidgwick did a better job of sympathetically entering into Green's philosophy than Green did of sympathetically entering into Sidgwick's. For his part, Sidgwick often felt that way. Green, he felt, had "sniffed" at his parapsychological investigations into the possibility of an afterlife, a bit of natural theology that Sidgwick thought might help support some form of religious belief. And in an 1870 letter to his friend Roden Noel, in which he discussed a paper Noel wished to send to Green, Sidgwick confessed:

As to Green I do not know whether I advise sending it to him. He is in the state of mind in which he does not care about other people's opinions, & rather shuns them- a state of mind not unnatural in an original, rather lethargic intellect, conscious of thoughts unworked out. At least he does not care a bit about my opinions: he might care more about yours. Only my vanity you see, will not allow me exactly to promise you that he will.

If you like I will ask him. I think he would quite allow that he had made Aristotle Hegelianize and would maintain that A. can only so be made profitable. (quoted in Schultz, Eye of the Universe, p. 441)

And of course, it was the spectre of Green lurking behind the heated personal attack on Sidgwick launched by the famous economist Alfred Marshall, in which the latter blasted Sidgwick for his mania for "over-regulation" and tendency to drive away students. Marshall contrasted Sidgwick 's lecture room with the late Green's, "in which a hundred men- half of them B.A.'s-ignoring examinations, were wont to hang on the lips of the man who was sincerely anxious to teach them the truth about the universe and human life" (Memoir, p. 394). Sidgwick meditated on the charges, and comforted himself with the thought that perhaps he fit Clough 's description of Bagehot: "Though without much fame, he had no envy. But he had a strong realism. He saw what it is considered cynical to see-the absurdities of many persons, the pomposities of many creeds, the splendid zeal with which missionaries rush on to teach what they do not know, the wonderful earnestness with which most incomplete solutions of the universe are thrust upon us as complete and satisfying." He added parenthetically that "This represents my relation to T. H. G. and his work" (Memoir, p. 394). It would have distressed but not surprised Sidgwick to learn that he would still be treated to invidious comparisons with Green over a century after his death.

But my defense of Sidgwick is also a recommendation of Brink, whose sharp analytical style is very much on display in these works. If he is long on reconstruction and short on contextualization, he nonetheless displays an impressive acuity in bringing out the philosophical gist of Green's claims, and he is far too honest and clear-headed to thrust upon us "incomplete solutions of the universe" without pronouncing them exactly that. He is surely right to call attention to Green's work, and his enthusiasm for it never succeeds in deluding the Sidgwickian side of his philosophical conscience.