Performance Epistemology: Foundations and Applications

Placeholder book cover

Miguel Angel Fernandez Vargas (ed.), Performance Epistemology: Foundations and Applications, Oxford University Press, 2016, 250pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198746942.

Reviewed by Gordon Barnes, The College at Brockport, State University of New York


This collection explores the foundations and applications of a certain type of virtue epistemology which the editor calls "performance-based epistemology". Ernest Sosa is the founder of this approach, and he contributes the opening essay. The rest of the essays each respond to Sosa's work in some way. The authors are well chosen, since they offer sharply contrasting views on fundamental questions in epistemology. They include such notable figures as Hilary Kornblith, Richard Fumerton, Paul Boghossian and Ram Neta. The topics range from the nature of epistemic virtue and epistemic luck to a priori knowledge and the epistemology of stupidity. The essays are all worth reading, but I will not discuss all of them. I will begin with a brief sketch of the basic framework of performance-based epistemology, including Sosa's essay. Then I will turn to Kornblith's, which poses a direct and fundamental challenge to the project of performance-based epistemology. In light of Kornblith's critique, I will then discuss the essays by Baron Reed, Fumerton, Jesper Kallestrup and Duncan Pritchard, and Peter Graham. I have chosen these because they offer sharply contrasting views on two fundamental questions in this area. Should we see human cognition as something akin to intentional action, in which human beings are agents, or should we view human cognition as an unintentional, natural process? And which purposes set the standards for human cognition -- nature's purposes, or our own?

Performance-based epistemology "conceives believing and judging as types of performances with an epistemic aim, that are carried out by persons." (1) Performances are evaluated by how they are related to an agent's competence. If believing and judging are performances, then they should be evaluated in the same way. That is the core idea of performance-based epistemology. Sosa first developed this type of theory, and I will begin with a brief sketch of his view. He identifies three merits that any performance can possess. If a performance achieves its goal, then it is accurate. If a performance manifests an agent's competence, then it is adroit. And if a performance is accurate because it is adroit, then it is apt. Beliefs are performances, and so they can possess these merits. If a belief is true, then it is accurate. If a belief manifests an agent's cognitive competence, then it is adroit. And if a belief is true because it manifests the agent's cognitive competence, then it is apt.

For Sosa, apt belief is a kind of knowledge, which he calls "animal knowledge." In order for a belief to be apt, it must be true because it manifests the agent's cognitive competence. Generally speaking, a "complete competence" consists of three elements: an innermost skill, an inner state and an appropriate situation. An innermost skill is a disposition or ability to succeed if the agent is in an appropriate inner state and an appropriate outer situation. The ability to drive is an ability to drive successfully if one is not drunk or asleep (inner state), and the lighting conditions and weather are suitable for driving (situation). If an agent possesses an innermost skill, is in an appropriate state, and is in an appropriate situation, then Sosa says that the agent has a "complete competence." The idea of a cognitive competence follows this pattern. If an epistemic agent has the ability to form true beliefs of a certain sort, and the agent is in an appropriate inner state and also in an appropriate situation, then the agent possesses a complete cognitive competence. And if such an agent succeeds in forming a true belief because she manifests this competence, then she knows, at least in the sense of having animal knowledge.

In his essay, Sosa argues that animal knowledge is compatible with certain kinds of luck. If a true belief manifests the relevant complete competence, then the subject has animal knowledge, even if she is lucky to have the relevant skill, be in the appropriate state, or be in an appropriate situation. Using a series of examples, Sosa argues that apt action is compatible with luck. In one example, a fighter pilot named Simone trains regularly in perfect simulations. Then the pilot is strapped down every night, while she is asleep, either into a simulation or a real cockpit. When she wakes up, Simone cannot tell whether she is in a simulation or a real cockpit. One day she wakes up in a real cockpit, and she shoots real targets. When Simone hits a real target, Sosa maintains that her success manifests her complete competence, and thus her success is apt. Of course, Simone is just lucky to be in a real cockpit, rather than a simulation. But her action is apt, despite her luck. In another example, a basketball player plays in an indoor venue, where his shots are "calmly apt," but he might just as well have been playing in a windy, outdoor venue, where his shots would have been buffeted by high winds. Here again, the player's shots are accurate because they manifest his competence, despite the fact that he is lucky to be in an appropriate situation. Sosa concludes that apt action is compatible with being lucky to be in an appropriate situation. And he invites us to infer, by analogy, that the same is true of apt belief (20-21). Since apt belief constitutes animal knowledge, these agents have animal knowledge, despite their luck in being in an appropriate situation.

Throughout his essay, Sosa compares beliefs and judgments to various kinds of performances. In "Epistemic Agency" Kornblith objects to that comparison. He avers that "Beliefs don't seem to be performances. They are not actions. They do not seem to be something that we do." (177) Kornblith argues that many beliefs, such as perceptual beliefs, are formed automatically and unintentionally. Believers do not aim or intend to form a perceptual belief, and then act on that intention. On the contrary, "I open my eyes and see a table in front of me and thereby come to acquire the belief that I am standing in front of a table." (179) Kornblith does not deny that we often perform actions like focusing our attention, and that these actions precede the operation of belief-forming processes. But he denies that we thereby exercise any "epistemic agency." Much of Kornblith's essay is a sustained critique of the idea that reflective knowledge is superior to animal knowledge. Drawing extensively on empirical findings in psychology, Kornblith argues that second-order reflection on our beliefs is an unreliable method of correcting the cognitive biases that typically lead us astray. The reason is that we are typically unaware of these biases and the role that they play in producing our beliefs. So when we are asked to reflect on how we formed a certain belief, we are unable to identify the true cause of the belief. So we fabricate an explanation that both misrepresents and rationalizes the source of our belief. Kornblith concludes that reflection is no more reliable than the first-order processes that produce mere animal knowledge. There is no reason to prefer reflective knowledge to animal knowledge. In conclusion, Kornblith proposes that we abandon the idea of epistemic agency as a foundation for epistemic normativity. If we want a source of epistemic normativity, then we would do better to look to nature's purposes -- functions. It is nature's purposes that set the standards for knowledge, not our own purposes.

By contrast, Reed contends that "knowledge is the result of an epistemic agent's being active" (110). In "Who Knows?" Reed argues that knowledge requires more than just the right relationship between a belief and the world, or even the right relationship between a cognitive faculty and the world. Knowledge requires that the whole person be related to the world in the right way, and the right relation between a person and the world is one that is active. Reed's main argument begins with the observation that two cognitive processes can produce opposing verdicts in a single person, and if the agent simply disregards one of these sources, then she will not have knowledge, even if her belief was reliably produced. Reed concludes that in order to have knowledge, the knower must actively synthesize the products of her cognitive faculties in the right sort of way. This requires that one be "monitoring, from the rational point of view, how one's beliefs are adapting to changes in one's environment" (117). Epistemic agency is required for knowledge.

The contrast between Kornblith and Reed raises a question for each of them. Reed's thesis is that knowers must reflect on the processes that produce their beliefs and respond to them appropriately. However, as Kornblith documents, we now have empirical evidence that this sort of reflection is extremely unreliable. When we reflect on the processes that produce our beliefs, we misidentify them, and we fabricate a false narrative about the origin of our belief. Does that empirical finding vitiate Reed's ideal of epistemic agency? If not, then why not? On the other hand, what would Kornblith say about cases in which we have apparent evidence against a belief that was actually produced by a reliable process? In that situation doesn't knowledge require reflection? And if so, then isn't that a kind of epistemic agency? Kornblith would likely agree on the need for reflection, but deny that this involves anything like agency. Although we can decide to reflect, reflection itself is an unintentional cognitive process that is just as automatic as any other cognitive process. The concept of agency just isn't appropriate here.

At the other end of the epistemological spectrum lies the demanding internalism of Fumerton. In "Rising Above the Animals," Fumerton argues that "the epistemological assurance the philosopher seeks is something rather unusual, something, perhaps, that most people don't seek" (151). To make his case, Fumerton discusses Sosa's solutions to two basic objections to all externalist theories -- the New Evil Demon Problem, and the Problem of Easy Knowledge. If we imagine someone whose internal mental states are qualitatively identical to our own, at least with respect to phenomenal qualities, then it seems that such a person must have beliefs that are equally justified as our own. However, externalist theories imply that if such a person is being systematically deceived by an Evil Demon, then their beliefs are not justified, because they are produced by an unreliable process. Sosa has addressed this problem in subtle and ingenious ways, but Fumerton believes that the problem can be restated in a way that remains problematic for Sosa. According to Fumerton, "the internalist is simply asking a question about the conceptual connections to which the view is committed." (156) Consider the proposition that our sensations are caused by an Evil Demon, and also the proposition that we are disposed to form physical-object beliefs on the basis of those sensations. Do these two propositions jointly entail that our perceptual beliefs are unjustified? It seems that Sosa must answer "yes," but the right answer seems to be "no".

Fumerton then turns to the Problem of Easy Knowledge. The problem is that if there are basic sources of justification or knowledge, then it seems that we can use these sources to justify themselves. Many epistemologists find this objectionable. Fumerton thinks that Sosa's views actually aggravate this problem. Sosa seems to accept the idea that having a justified belief on the basis of experience requires that we have a justified commitment to the proposition that our perceptual faculties are reliable in the relevant way. But for Sosa, this commitment consists in nothing more than a stable disposition to form the belief that our faculties are reliable in this way. As Fumerton sees it, this is problematic because "it seems that the conditions that constitute the [perceptual] belief being justified (at the animal level) contain as constituents the conditions that constitute the relevant commitment / disposition being justified." Consequently, it seems that the aptness of a first-order perceptual belief will suffice for the aptness of the metabelief that our reliable.

Although Fumerton develops these objections with rigor and ingenuity, the objections themselves are not new. Moreover, as Fumerton knows, the principles on which these objections are based threaten to lead to a very radical form of skepticism. His response is to distinguish between "ideal justification," which is what philosophers want, and a "degenerate" sort of justification that can be had without ideal justification (157). What the philosopher wants is a kind of assurance that externalism fails to provide. Here again, the fundamental issue is whether the standards for human cognition are set by nature's purposes, or by our own purposes -- in this case, the philosopher's purpose of achieving complete assurance.

In "Dispositional Robust Virtue Epistemology versus Anti-luck Virtue Epistemology," Kallestrup and Pritchard argue that epistemic virtue, as Sosa conceives it, is neither necessary nor sufficient for knowledge. What is necessary and sufficient for knowledge is that the subject's belief be safe -- that there are no relevantly similar possible situations in which her belief is false. To demonstrate the insufficiency of epistemic virtue for knowledge, Kallestrup and Pritchard carefully construct a Twin Earth counterexample. On Epistemic Twin Earth, a subject is normally in an environment in which there is only H2O. In the example, she is also presently in such an environment, where there is only H2O. But nearby, in a region where the subject might easily have been, there is XYZ. When this subject believes that the liquid around her is water, she does not know that it is water, because her belief could easily have been false. Kallestrup and Pritchard argue that this example shows that epistemic virtue, as Sosa understands it, is insufficient for knowledge. That is because knowledge also requires the satisfaction of a safety condition. It must be the case that the subject's belief could not too easily have been false. I will return to this example very shortly, after I summarize Graham's essay, which is relevant to it.

In "Against Actual-world Reliabilism," Graham argues against the position that the epistemically correct procedures are those that are reliable in the actual world. He poses a dilemma for this position: either there is one and only one actual world (absolutism), or "actual" is an indexical, referring to the world in which it is thought or uttered. If only one world is actual, then actual-world reliabilism implies that in a world in which clairvoyance is reliable, clairvoyance-beliefs are unjustified. That seems false. However, if "actual" refers to the world in which is it thought or uttered, then a process like clairvoyance will produce beliefs that are both justified and unjustified in all worlds, because "justification in all worlds" becomes relative to a world. This is also unacceptable. Thus Graham concludes that we should reject actual-world reliabilism. In its place, Graham proposes that reliabilists should relativize reliability, not to the actual world, but rather to "normal" or "natural" circumstances or conditions. By "normal" or "natural" Graham does not mean "typical." Rather, normal circumstances are "relative to kinds." Thus, a normal circumstance for a fish is to be in water. If we relativize reliability to normal or natural circumstances, then we can say that in a world in which clairvoyance is reliable, clairvoyant beliefs are justified, because that process is reliable in circumstances that are normal or natural for the inhabitants of that world. This is a significant advantage over actual-world reliabilism. Graham's use of the idea of normal or natural circumstances could be developed in terms of the concept of natural functions, and Graham explicitly compares his account to those of Ruth Millikan and Alvin Plantinga, both of whom appeal to natural functions in their theories of knowledge. On this view, it would be nature's purposes (or, for Plantinga, God's purposes) that set the standards for knowledge. Finally, consider again the Twin Earth example constructed by Kallestrup and Pritchard. We might respond to that example by saying that on Twin Earth, as described, the subject's ability to identify water has the natural function of identifying water in an environment in which there is only H2O, not XYZ. Then we might be able to explain the fact that in the imagined example, the subject does not have knowledge, without appealing to any modal conditions like safety.

All of the other essays (by John Greco, Alan Millar, John Turri, Paul Boghossian, Stephen Grimm, Pascal Engel, and Ram Neta) are excellent, and deserve to be read. I have focused on those discussed above because they all raise the same fundamental questions. Is human cognition best understood as something like intentional action, in which the agent is in control, or is it better understood as a natural process, in which we are passive vehicles of natural forces? And which purposes set the standards for excellent human cognition -- nature's purposes, or our own, human purposes?