Performatives After Deconstruction

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Mauro Senatore (ed.), Performatives After Deconstruction, Bloomsbury, 2013, 253pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441123466.

Reviewed by Vernon W. Cisney, Gettysburg College


Every contribution in this outstanding collection demonstrates that if deconstruction 'appropriates' the performative that finds its roots in the tradition of speech act theory, it is in order to push its logic to the point where it becomes unrecognizable. The 'performative' in speech act theory is a linguistic execution that, by its announcement, enacts the event that it announces. Standard examples of such speech acts are promises, wedding vows, clergy pronouncements of marriage, baptisms, declarations of war and peace, etc. However, what all of these localized performatives share is their lack of any genetic justification for the agents who make the pronouncements -- it is assumed a priori that the subject who 'performs' the performative is a sovereign authority, qualified to execute such pronouncements. Hence the performative in the traditional sense does not get at the constitution of the 'power' whereby the performative itself is executed, what we might call the 'performativity of the performative.' It is this broader sense of performativity, far exceeding speech act theory proper, that is of interest to the deconstructive tradition. At this point, allow me to address some of the specifics of the individual contributions.

The book brings together ten new pieces, along with Mauro Senatore's impressive introduction (offering a broad deconstructive reading of the performative as positing), and a stimulating epilogue by Alexander García Düttmann (a reading of the passage that Derrida asked to have read at his funeral). The contributions focus on a myriad of topics, both theoretical and 'performative,' and ranging from artworks to psychoanalysis, normativity, hospitality, the archive, life, and literature. The volume is divided into four major parts. The first, according to the editor, focuses on the question of historicity, and includes the contributions by Ellen Burt, Diane Davis, and Matthias Fritsch. The second part deals with the performative structure of the event, and includes the chapters by Herman Rapaport, Francesco Vitale, and Simon Wortham. The third part develops a reading of the mark as the minimal structural trait of performativity, and includes the pieces by Jonthan Lahey Dronsfield and John Phillips. Finally, Part Four includes essays by Martin McQuillan and John Mullarkey (along with the epilogue by Düttmann), and focuses on the future(s) of performativity.

Chapter one is Burt's "Promising Hospitality: l'Étranger Gives the Law in D'Alembert's 'Genève'". This is a stimulating reading of the notion of hospitality in 'Genève' (1757) by D'Alembert, centered on the status of the foreigner and inoculation in D'Alembert's text.

In "Performative Perfume", Davis takes a cue from Derrida's Acts of Literature, and employs the term 'perfumativity' in order to characterize what she calls the 'power without power' that constitutes the nature of performativity for Derrida (p. 73). Like a perfume, which has no 'power', however forceful the scent it exudes, Davis articulates a fundamental 'powerlessness', exceeding the power/powerless binary, in the command for a response that precedes and conditions the performance of the performative. On a basic level, she notes that Derrida's deconstructive analyses of iterability have always entailed as much. Insofar as iterability is the necessary condition of all uses of the sign, there remains in every communicative act, even the most seemingly 'authentic', something of the automatic; a 'powerlessness' of the speaker inasmuch as she is unable to fully master her own discourse. But more fundamentally, and conditioning the communicative act, there is what calls for the performance of the 'I' itself, a primary affirmation already indicative of an other that exceeds me. This affirmation can only be cordoned off or limited artificially; it is not one that can ever be grasped in or appropriated by the sovereignty of the subject (inasmuch as it is what conditions the subject). Thus (and contra traditional speech act theory), the performative cannot, strictly speaking, 'decide' or 'institute' anything, it cannot establish norms or 'legitimize' a given future, or rather, it can do so only by reining in the performative's status as 'event.' Hence, performativity for Davis is found in the infinite and impossible notion of 'response-ability.'

Matthias Fritsch's excellent "The Performative and the Normative" is nicely situated, following the question of normativity with respect to the performative, taken up in the latter sections of Davis's piece. But more significantly, it offers a valuable interpolation into the ongoing debate in Derrida scholarship among those scholars who have consistently argued for a more or less robust religio-ethical dimension in Derrida's thinking, (such as Simon Critchley, John D. Caputo, and Robert Bernasconi), and those scholars who reject a dimension of 'normativism' in Derrida's work (Ernesto Laclau and Martin Hägglund). With admirable clarity and conciseness, Fritsch argues for a distinction between a general and a strict sense of performativity, arguing that the general sense of performativity, (the sense of performativity 'after Derrida'), encompasses a relational tension between self-staging and pre-subjective alterity.

Most accepted intellectual histories of the performative operate only at the level of the 'strict' sense of the performative (the linguistic speech act of the subject), posing a binary opposition between two camps. According to these histories, theorists like Austin and Searle distinguish radically between 'serious' and 'fictional' utterances and argue that fictional utterances are derivative of and subordinate to the conventions of linguistic use; while critics (like Stanley Fish, Shoshana Felman, and Derrida) undermine the borders between serious and non-serious linguistic uses. What these histories fail to note, Fritsch argues, is that the performativity that concerns Derrida is one that exceeds the linguistic communicative acts of human speakers, a performativity of 'being in general' (p. 88), or 'the event of being' (p. 102). The alterity of the event exceeds and makes possible the 'self' of performativity in the 'strict' sense. Yet we would be mistaken to read this as an exclusion of the 'strict' sense of the performative. Rather, the 'general', 'after-Derrida' sense of the performative must maintain the tension between the self of 'strict' performativity, and the alterity of the event, 'between performative power and normative impotence' (p. 86), and it must constantly negotiate the tension between the constitutedness of the self, and the alterity that constitutes it. This raises the question of normativity in Derrida's writings, where Fritsch argues that we ought to think of the 'normative' dimension in Derrida's thinking as the relational term to the performative in the 'strict' sense. Hägglund is right to note that the normative dimension in Derrida's thought cannot entail the establishment of norms or rules, which would be 'chosen' and enacted by constituted subjects. On the contrary, the very logic of the performative in the general sense precludes the final solidification, of either self or other, necessary for such prescriptions. Hence it is essential to distinguish, Fritsch argues, between a traditional sense of normativity (the characteristics of which are the targets of Hägglund), and Derrida's sense of the normative, which entails an ongoing openness to alterity, in all its senses: temporal, human, and non-human others.

While we might say that the contributions of Davis and Fritsch are concerned with the constitutive relation from the other to the self, Herman Rapaport's "Performativity as Ek-Scription: Adonis After Derrida" focuses on the passage from the self to the other, in the self's own performative 'writing' of itself, 'the invention of one's own idiom' (p. 110). But in so externalizing oneself, Derrida's analyses of iterability entail that the performance is essentially determined to fall short of its intention. There will always be a remainder of meaning that is inappropriable by the speaker, as the act of communication itself relies upon a system of signs that precedes and survives the empirical locution. Even in the act of signature, it is implied that the signature will survive the death of the signatory. At the same time, this writing that leaves behind the subject, which Rapaport here calls 'ek-scription', is also what guarantees that a text 'lives on', allowing it to traverse national and linguistic borders and temporal limits. Rapaport makes this case by way of an illuminating reading of the Syrian poet, Ali Ahmad Said Esber, who assumed the pen name 'Adonis' as a way of 'exiling' himself from his own national-historical limitations. In the essay's final sections, Rapaport demonstrates this ek-scription by drawing parallels in Adonis' poetry between the destruction of Beirut, linking the notion of 'civilization' to that of 'war' and hence, lamenting the destruction of New York, in a way that, thirty years prior to the attacks of 9/11, already mourned the event. Somewhat concerning to me, given the deconstructive penchant (which I share) for subtle distinctions, is Rapaport's imprecise vacillation between 'ek-scription' (with a 'k') and 'ex-scription' (with an 'x'). This imprecision is found not only in the body of the text itself, but also in the conflict between the title of the essay and the title of the essay's second section. All the same, Rapaport's is an interesting contribution, and a good example of a 'practice' of the performative.

In "Living On: The Absolute Performative", Francesco Vitale proposes -- rightly, I think -- that we should 'grasp the movement of différance' (p. 131) through the notion of 'survival,' a 'life beyond life' (quoting Derrida, p. 132) that precedes the binary opposition between life and death. Vitale argues that at the heart of deconstruction lies an 'unconditional yes to life' (p. 139) that is not a conservation of one's identity or one's consciousness, and hence is not a 'will to life' (p. 139), such as one might find in a traditional voluntaristic metaphysics. Rather, this unconditional 'yes' is the welcoming of the future as the unforeseeable, the 'repetition of itself beyond the present towards the future' (p. 140). It is for this reason that in his final interview Derrida refers to 'survival' in this sense as 'the most intense life possible' (p. 132). Vitale explores this concept of survival through remarks on some of Derrida's engagements with the narratives of Maurice Blanchot. According to Vitale, the centrality of narrative for Derrida lies in the fact that, contra the phenomenological tradition, which can only ever conceive of temporalization through the presence of the 'living present,' narrative articulates temporalization in terms of traces that are 'absolutely different' (p. 136) from the presence to which they refer. This differentiation, which makes possible the constitution of the present, also points futurally toward the 'to-come.' Survival, therefore, is understood as a self-protention (using the language of phenomenology), but one that necessarily marks itself, according to the logic of iterability inherent to the 'trace', as a constant differing and deferring that 'must differ from the living present' (p. 142).

In "Archive-Abilities", Simon Morgan Wortham argues for a deconstructive reading of the event, inseparable from the notions of impression and archive. The archive is not simply a collection of 'dead' facts, nor is it based upon a fact-of-the-matter about what is 'archivable'. The 'rules' of archivability are themselves produced in the archivization itself. This concept of the archive therefore requires a radical rethinking of the humanities, no longer as repositories of the past, but as productions of the future. But this in turn requires also a new thinking of the human itself.

Jonathan Lahey Dronsfield, in his strong essay, "The Performativity of Art", argues that while Derrida curiously never offers a differential typology of performative iterability pertaining to artworks, nevertheless his analyses of the signature and countersignature provide a point of entry for thinking the 'performativity of the visual artwork' (p. 172). The signature of the artist both attests to her own absence, and acts as a promise of sincerity and truth in the work. But the artwork requires also the countersignature(s): in order for there to be an experience of the artwork, the spectator must get involved. Moreover, there is the countersignature of the sociopolitical, the institutional framework without which there would be no artwork. The performativity of the artwork thus entails a reciprocal relationality between signature and countersignature(s), without which no artwork appears. But it appears only insofar as it at the same time produces the vision whereby it is seen. 'This is what artworks do, they make our eyes' (p. 184).

John W. P. Phillips offers a close reading of "Signature événement contexte" in his compelling essay, "Passive Performative".  He argues that the structure of iterability 'implies an immediate (a priori) externalization of structure itself' (p. 189). On this basis, he reads Derrida's deconstructive remarks on Austin as critical reflections on the deconstruction of morality carried out by Nietzsche. On the basis of the notion of iterability, Phillips argues for a rigorous distinction between deconstruction as it is mobilized explicitly by the trace, and the modes of deconstruction found in thinkers like Nietzsche, where a certain deconstruction is already at work but where the project, insofar as it is not oriented by the thought of iterability, is bound to the language of the very system it hopes to disrupt.

Martin McQuillan and John Mullarkey deal with the future(s) of the performative. In "Departures: The American Future of Psychoanalysis," McQuillan argues for a structural cruelty that accompanies the establishment of any institution (whether philosophical, ideological, national, conceptual, or otherwise). Both deconstruction and psychoanalysis were able to burgeon in the United States only by way of a certain 'banalization,' a fate 'worse than being ignored' (p. 220), and this as a result of the 'cruelty' that McQuillan refers to as the American 'resistance to Theory' (p. 219). But this is an essential, not an accidental, element of the institution, one that awaits the cruelty that is America itself. The fate of any institution is that it must elude the sovereignty of its founder. In "Laruelle Contra Derrida: Performative Realism and the Logics of Consistency,"

Mullarkey offers a valuable discussion of the project of 'non-philosophy' as found in the recent works of François Laruelle. Laruelle espouses a position of 'performative realism', in which all thought is practice (i.e., performative), and all thought is merged with what he calls 'the Real', because thought is real. Hence there can be no 'explanation' of the Real, because any explanation would attempt to objectify the Real in order to explain it. All philosophy goes wrong, insofar as its author offers a 'decision' about the explanation of the Real, namely, that her own presentation of the Real is the 'right' presentation of the Real. Hence, Mullarkey shows, Laruelle understands his own thought as a more consistent 'enactment of Derrida's thought,' (p. 228), insofar as it plays with the aporias that thought reveals, while simultaneously avoiding the 'decision' that keeps Derrida situated in the order of philosophy.

My criticisms of the volume are few. First, I was disappointed that there were no contributions of an explicitly political nature. Though political concerns are by no means absent from the volume (there are discussions of 9/11, Western hegemony, and the violence of institutions sprinkled throughout), nevertheless it seems, especially in light of Fritsch's reference on p. 92 to the "Force of Law" essay, that there would be much room for exploration of the performative in terms of the law/justice relation in Derrida's thinking. Second, the title Performatives After Deconstruction is something of a misnomer. For a collection that claims to address 'deconstruction', a cursory glance at the table of contents and index reveals that the essays are focused almost exclusively on Derrida. Besides mentions here and there of figures such as Rodolphe Gasché, Paul de Man, Hélène Cixous, Émile Benveniste, and Werner Hamacher, the introduction and the final two chapters are the only exceptions to this exclusivity. This leads me to suspect that the initial vision of the volume was Performatives After Derrida, and indeed, in-text citations by Fritsch (p. 86) and Rapaport (p. 114) of this very phrase, 'after Derrida', lend support to this suspicion. I am admittedly being a bit nitpicky, and this near-exclusive focus on Derrida detracts little from the volume overall. Senatore has assembled a stellar group of scholars, and together they have compiled an exceptional collection of essays on a topic that is close to the heart of deconstruction and, in light of this, has been too often overlooked. Each contribution brings something unique to this volume, and I suspect that it will have an important and lasting effect on the way we read Derrida.