Permissible Progeny? The Morality of Procreation and Parenting

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Sarah Hannan, Samantha Brennan, and Richard Vernon (eds.), Permissible Progeny? The Morality of Procreation and Parenting, Oxford University Press, 2015, 267pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199378128.

Reviewed by Jamie L. Nelson, Michigan State University


Permissible Progeny? After reading the eleven clearly written and clearly important chapters (opened by a fine substantive introduction by Sarah Hannan), the temptation may be to think the answer to the title's question is no. The collection, which emerged from a conference held at Ontario's Western University in June of 2013, doesn't spend much attention on specific instances of controverted procreation -- aged fathers, postmenopausal mothers, or purposefully deaf children are absent, and so-called "savior siblings" make only a brief appearance. While the essays take up a wide and sometimes surprisingly rich range of tough moral- and political-theoretic issues prompted by procreation and parenting, the tenor of the text is that, given environmental fragility and existing children in need of families, bearing and begetting as such are morally fraught enterprises, certainly on the defensive, and possibly best seen as indulgence in an expensive hobby. Anti-natalism is taken in general quite seriously throughout, sometimes bracketed, but never directly confronted.

Other persistent similarities, if not quite unifying themes, run through the essays. Several are taken up with working out a liberal or left-libertarian political perspective on their issues; accordingly, anti-perfectionism is, for some, a guiding star. On the "ideal"/"non-ideal" theory frontier, the approaches here are typically on the former side of the border; while feminist authors, for example, are discussed (Christine Overall, according to both the index and my eye test, is the single most cited author in the book overall) and well represented among the contributors and volume editors (e.g., Elizabeth Brake, Carolyn McLeod, Samantha Brennan, inter alia,), rather few of the chapters are much taken up with the ways class, race, disability, or gender might complicate analysis or conclusions about reproducing and rearing kids. The collection is best seen, I think, as offering the highly sophisticated reflections of a fairly homogenous set of philosophical and political thinkers on a topically coherent array of important and underexplored issues to which their generally overlapping and typically high-level perspectives have a good deal to contribute.

The level of abstraction at which the essays tend to be pitched doesn't at all make them bloodless, however. On the contrary, many are bold, innovative, and unsettling. The first contribution for instance, David Benatar's "The Misanthropic Argument for Anti-natalism" argues for a conclusion familiar for those acquainted with Benatar's work, but in a distinctive way. Here, anti-natalism's support derives not from the wrong done to children by bringing them into this rough world, but from the harms to other humans, nonhuman animals, and the environment the children are sure to inflict once they arrive. The essay exhibits Benatar's characteristic creativity and relentless willingness to follow the argument where it leads. It also is saturated with empirical detail, as exemplified by a vivid appeal to the abundance of human excreta to counter any appeal to the distinctive forms of beauty childbirth brings into the world. Benatar sinks all history's mangers and other maternity wards -- and presumably, all history's galleries, all of its libraries and museums -- in a great flood of sewage.

Jason Marsh follows Benatar's treatment of the havoc we wreak by forging a novel linkage between the harm we suffer and procreative ethics. Marsh reasons that if the world is so bad as to render the existence of an all-good and omnipotent God unlikely, it is also bad enough to make the moral acceptability of procreation unlikely. Marsh is admirably nimble in defusing the apparent disanalogies between a Creator and procreators that immediately tumble into mind. His discussion of an "optimistic" argument from evil -- roughly, that the world is a decent-enough place to bring children into, but a omnipotent and benevolent God would have done so much better -- raises some particularly interesting points about whether it might be wrong to inflict some harms, not merely on some so that others may benefit, but on a single individual, even if those harms are required to confer more significant benefits on that individual herself. If so, even parents who can be reasonably sure that their children's lives will be worth living may have something more about which to lose sleep.

Anca Gheaus changes the tenor of the first pair of essays by taking seriously the possibility that there could be a duty to have children (about whom we have good reason to think will lead acceptably good lives). Her reasons are much caught up with the profound distress that would presumably afflict the last few humans, as their needs for care and companionship increase and there are fewer and fewer people in any position to meet them. Aware that the burdens of procreation fall unequally on women, Gheaus makes any such procreative duty contingent on the development of ectogenesis, as an ethical demand to bear and deliver a child against one's inclinations is too great an intrusion into a woman's life. One might develop the thought further: given the still greater intrusions of years of child care, the duty's force might well depend upon a just allocation of those responsibilities among parents and between parents and the societies in which they live. And this sort of thought seems to be Gheaus's real concern. For if people generally have an interest in not being among the last generation of human beings, then fairness would seem to demand that the costs of birthing and rearing the young be shared.

Cory MacIver's contribution, "Procreation or Appropriation?," methodically connects producing progeny to environmental depredation. He argues that, as creating a new person is always to create a new set of claims to the natural resources required for a minimally decent life, the responsibility for doing so lies with (presumably, uncompelled) procreators. Arguing in a way well designed to make his assumptions at each step as plain as possible, he maintains that as procreation cannot be seen as a merely private, self-regarding interest, nor as fundamental to leading a minimally decent life, it cannot be exempted from scrutiny or possible state intervention. MacIver does not commit himself to any particular threshold of allowable procreation, nor pause over the question of whether prospective parents with diverse social histories should face different thresholds. Nor does he specify the kinds of responses violating them might defensibly trigger. He does do a good deal to show that questions of this kind deserve pondering.

Procreation is not, of course, the only, or perhaps the most supportable avenue to becoming a parent, as Brake's "Creation Theory" notes. As MacIver has made vivid, starting or extending a family via procreation involves massive consumption of scarce resources. In addition, Brake observes, it involves "failing in a duty to assist" children without parents. For adults contemplating parenthood, this duty to assist is portrayed as something like a duty of easy rescue: if you happen to be committed to becoming a parent, adoption seems a way of doing so that helps another greatly, with little in the way of extra costs or reduced benefits. Gheaus's argument might be seen as a way of showing why such a rescue might not be quite so costless as first appears. Rearing a child you've conceived or begotten can in principle be defended due to the significance of genetic ties, as they are manifested in forms of physical and temperamental similarities of just the kind that Wittgenstein alludes to in introducing the concept of family resemblances in the Philosophical Investigations ยง66: "a complicated network of similarities overlapping and criss-crossing; similarities in the large and in the small" (2009, p. 36). The rest of the work is done by the thought that in bringing children with traits characteristic of one's family into the world, one increases its value, analogously to how a new painting by David Hockney -- recognizably a Hockney, yet distinctively so -- presumably increases the world's aesthetic value.

The following chapter, by Steven Lecce and Erik Magnusson, takes up the political significance of different reasons for reproduction; the answer to their title question, "Do Motives Matter?," is "not as such, as a basis for state action, anyway." For example, children brought into being to serve as "savior siblings" for brothers or sisters needing transplant of compatible tissues, for example, are not wronged in the motivation for their birth in any politically salient way -- unless such motives can be reliably seen as predictors of how parents will care for their children.

In a brief but sharply argued piece, Meena Krishnamurthy takes on L. A. Paul's celebrated article, "What You Can't Expect When You're Expecting" (2015). Paul argues that one cannot make a rational decision whether or not to have children, unless one has had children -- however you might acquire your children (presumably), the experience of doing so is "unique and transformative" (p. 173). Krishnamurthy maintains contra Paul that one can certainly reason effectively on such matters employing "nonphenomenal values"; you might conclude on reflection that your ethical values preclude begetting or bearing kids (if rational deliberation of this sort were not possible, much of Permissible Progeny? would be rather beside the point.) Krishnamurthy also argues that phenomenal values could indeed provide one with a rational basis to have children -- one might, for example, reasonably value transformative experiences as such.

The following three papers might be read as something of a loosely bound set, focusing on adoption versus procreation as paths to parenthood, on the relationship of a right to reproduce to standards of childrearing competence, and on how such topics intersect. In "Can a Right to Reproduce Justify the Status Quo on Parental Licensing?," Andrew Botterell and McLeod continue their critique of the notion that prospective adoptive parents be vetted and certified by the state begun in their "'Not for the Faint of Heart': Assessing the Status Quo on Adoption and Parental Licensing" (2014). This new chapter focuses on the notion that a right to reproduce can justify requiring adoptive parents to be (in effect) licensed, while allowing procreative parents (including those using assisted reproductive technologies) the presumption of child rearing competency. Botterell and McLeod's strategy rests on impugning the very idea of a right to reproduce. The authors do, however, make a very intriguing possible exception: those whose reproductive actions are a response to eugenic practices that have targeted their social group may indeed have a right to reproduce.

Jurgen De Wispelaere and Daniel Weinstock's "Privileging Adoption over Reproduction?" considers how states might promote adoption. Having previously argued in favor of the state dis-incentivizing the use of Assisted Reproductive Technologies (ARTs) by pricing mechanisms that would be sensitive to the practical availability of adoption (the easier it is to adopt children, the more expensive it ought to be to use ARTs; the tougher to adopt, the less expensive to use ARTs), the present task is to deal with the observation that the policy they favor indefensibly exempts those who can procreate without the aid of ART. The authors argue that those capable of procreating without ARTs cannot be either constrained from doing so, or successfully incentivized to adopt by fiscal considerations. Yet there remain legitimate ways of shifting culturally prevalent attitudes that privilege procreation and hence of discouraging the "expensive taste" that is procreation (p. 208).

Colin MacLeod's "Parental Competency and the Right to Parent" walks a thin line between requiring a "robust" standard of competency rooted in children's justice-based entitlements, and not overly restricting the set of adults who may function as parents. Rejecting the idea that parental authority is justified only insofar as it serves the interests of children, MacLeod builds on "creative self-extension," or the interest people have in expressing their conception of the good, and in securing its influence in the lives of others. Provided that parents observe the need to respect and develop their children's autonomy, their interest in the promulgation of their own moral, political, stylistic and religious understandings both justifies and limits the range of allowable cultural "scripts" families may enact. Against this parental interest, MacLeod balances the interests of children; as he sees it, they have justice-based claims to the satisfaction of basic needs, to an "autonomy-facilitating" upbringing, to be loved, and to enjoy childhood's intrinsic goods. A parent's ability to provide such goods may be supplemented by others -- e.g., education and social service providers -- in what MacLeod calls a "division of moral labor."

The volume's final paper, Matthew Clayton's "How Much Do We Owe to Children?," continues to push on the theme of obligations to children, but expands as well the point that "we" who bear the obligations need not be thought of as solely the children's parents. Clayton's aims do not actually include determining who holds the responsibilities he identifies; rather, he draws on Rawls to argue that children have a right to an upbringing that will provide them with the two "moral powers," an effective sense of justice and the capacity to form and pursue an ethical conception. As to the amount of resources that ought to be devoted to providing children with the relevant competencies -- bearing in mind that individual children's needs in this respect will differ sharply -- Ronald Dworkin's "hypothetical insurance" model provides the framework. Clayton envisages adults who are assured of a fair share of resources and opportunities over the whole of their lives, and who are informed about the costs and effects of different resource use choices. If such people were to imagine living another life, from birth to death, what portion of their total assets would they allocate to their childhood? Their answers, averaged out, provide a conception of a just allocation of resources to children.

If my experience with a mixed group of undergraduate students in a senior level ethics seminar is anything to go on, Permissible Progeny? teaches quite nicely. Getting a firm handle on the arguments pushes my students to put in some hard work but doesn't leave them flummoxed; the counterintuitive character of many of the conclusions stimulate their creativity as well as critical intelligence. Further -- at least for those inclined to take seriously that bearing or begetting children may well be gravely wrong, but in any event stands in need of careful defense -- college-age students may be precisely the audience you'd want for this book.


McLeod, C. and A. Botterell. 2014. "'Not for the Faint of Heart': Assessing the Status Quo in Adoption and Parental Licensing." In Baylis, F. and C. McLeod. Family-Making: Contemporary Ethical Challenges. Oxford: Oxford University Press. 2014.

Paul, L. 2015. "What You Can't Expect When You're Expecting." Res Philosophica 92 (2): 149-170.

Wittgenstein, L. 2009. Philosophical Investigations. Translated by G.E.M. Anscombe, P.M.S. Hacker, and J. Schulte. Oxford: Blackwell.