Perplexities of Consciousness

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Eric Schwitzgebel, Perplexities of Consciousness, MIT Press, 2011, 225pp., $27.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780262014908.

Reviewed by Uriah Kriegel, University of Arizona


In this fascinating book, Eric Schwitzgebel offers a sustained and thorough argument against the broadly Cartesian view of introspection as highly reliable. Through relentless examination of extraordinarily many case studies, drawn from introspectively based everyday self-understanding as well as the history of introspectionist and proto-introspectionist psychology, Schwitzgebel develops a pessimistic induction of sorts against this Cartesian view. The book's official thesis is that introspection is unreliable. The notion of unreliability is left intuitive, but appears to do with something like the following: introspection is unreliable in that it does not on the whole produce a preponderance of true and/or justified beliefs; sometimes it systematically leads to false/unjustified beliefs and sometimes it fails to produce any beliefs.[1]

The book is a joy to read. The text is informal and conversational, yet often lapses into rich and beautiful prose, and is in any case eminently readable throughout. But the book's main charm lies in Schwitzgebel's well-intentioned skepticism: his attitude to introspection is not dismissive or facile, but based on genuine curiosity and a wonder at the phenomena that exudes from every page. As a result, the discussion is often fresh and pulsating and is virtually never burdened by stale presuppositions and tired themes. For my part, I learned a tremendous amount from following Schwitzgebel in this intellectual adventure. In my capacity as reviewer, and a vaguely Cartesian one no less, I will focus on what I resist in Schwitzgebel's outlook. But with this book it really did feel that the journey was more important than the destination.

The book has eight chapters. Six work out the case for the unreliability of introspection with respect to certain individual types of phenomenology: dreams (Chapter 1), shape perception (Chapter 2), imagery (Chapter 3), human echolocation (Chapter 4), peripheral tactile experience (Chapter 6), and 'eyes-closed' phenomenology (Chapter 8). Two other chapters are more 'theoretical' (though each relies on three further case studies): Chapter 7 makes a sustained case for the unreliability of everyday, casual, naïve introspection, while Chapter 5 considers the prospects for graduating from everyday casual introspection to trained and disciplined introspection. I will focus on these two 'theoretical' chapters, since Schwitzgebel's overall message comes through most crisply in them, but will refer occasionally to points made in the other chapters.

Chapter 7, reprinted (in modified form) from the Philosophical Review, professes a twofold thesis: that introspection (i) is needed for a full scientific understanding of the mind but (ii) is unreliable not merely in highly artificial or unusual circumstances but also in normal, favorable circumstances. Thus we cannot do without it and cannot do with it. Part (i) of this is assumed, and the chapter is devoted to arguing for (ii). Schwitzgebel offers three cases in which introspection misleads us in normal, favorable circumstances: concerning the features and structures of concurrent emotional phenomenology, the scope and precision of peripheral visual phenomenology, and the very existence of cognitive phenomenology (a proprietary phenomenology of thinking). In each case, Schwitzgebel argues that introspection produces firm but false beliefs about the relevant phenomenology and/or fails to produce firm beliefs. Consider that the Cartesian ideal of complete transparency can be factorized into two parts: infallibility (if I believe that p, then p) and self-intimation (if p, then I believe that p). Schwitzgebel does not wish to simply offer a cleverly concocted counterexample to these claims, but to convince us that they are not even close to the truth: introspective beliefs about phenomenal facts have no tendency to be true, and phenomenal facts have no tendency to elicit introspective beliefs about them. Thus introspection is both generally inaccurate and generally ignorant -- these are the two facets of unreliability.[2]

When it comes to emotional phenomenology, Schwitzgebel focuses on the element of ignorance: introspection produces no distinct beliefs about elementary features of emotional experience. The following passage captures the main point:

Are joy, anger, fear, and other emotional states always felt phenomenally … or only sometimes? Is their phenomenology … always approximately the same, or does it differ widely from case to case? For example, is joy sometimes in the head, sometimes more visceral, sometimes a thrill, and sometimes an expansiveness, or, instead, does joy have a single, consistent core -- a distinctive, identifiable, unique experiential character? Is emotional consciousness simply the experience of one's bodily arousal … [or] can it include, or even be exhausted by, something less literally visceral? … Relatedly, most of us have a rather poor sense, I suspect, of what brings us pleasure and suffering. Do you really enjoy Christmas? (pp. 120-1)

Schwitzgebel's claim is that introspection appears impotent in the face of (most) such questions: far from emotional experience being self-intimating, it is largely opaque to our introspective faculty.

If the introspectionist (as I will call the friend of introspection, whether or not associated with introspectionist psychology) insists that he does have firm beliefs on such matters, I think Schwitzgebel has him pretty much on the ropes. But the introspectionist could plausibly argue that lack of firm beliefs about emotional phenomenology is due not to failure of introspection but to failure of post-introspective belief-formation. Consider the question of whether token experiences of a single emotional type, e.g., joy, are phenomenally diverse or boast a common phenomenal core. If we think of introspection along perceptual lines, there is no reason to expect introspection alone to answer such questions. Introspection puts us in contact with token emotional experiences; generalizations from such individual introspective encounters are a matter for inference, they are not delivered by introspection itself. Compare: even though every chair is visible, vision itself cannot answer the question 'is there a strict commonality among all chairs, or do chairs enjoy only family resemblance?' For that we turn to reason rather than vision. Similar remarks apply to questions about non-phenomenal joys, what brings us joy, and so on.[3] Partly with this in mind, the original introspectionists were careful to delimit the proper purview of introspection. Titchener (1912: 485) writes:

the data of introspection are never themselves explanatory; they tell us nothing of mental causation, or of physiological dependence, or of genetic derivation. The ideal introspective report is an accurate description, made in the interests of psychology, of some conscious process. Causation, dependence, development are then matters of inference.

Introspection proper can only describe concurrent emotional phenomenology; it does not generalize about it, track its standard causes, or reveal its underlying sub-personal mechanisms. Considerations of this sort suggest to me that Schwitzgebel's questions reveal a defect not in introspection but in the theory of introspection -- at least any theory that expects it to produce general and causal beliefs without the aid of post-introspective inference.

Schwitzgebel does address the reliability of purely descriptive introspection of concurrent token emotional experiences. His claim is that when he examines his own reliance on introspection in this way, he is underwhelmed by the confidence and detail such reliance yields. In this respect, introspection not only fails to be more reliable than external perception, as Descartes thought; it is positively less reliable:

Can you, through introspection, discern the gross and fine features of your emotional phenomenology as easily and confidently as you can, through vision, discern the gross and fine features of nearby external objects? (p. 122)

Paying unbiased attention to one's own experience as one introspects one's ongoing emotional life suffices, according to Schwitzgebel, to appreciate the limited reliability of untutored introspection.

I suspect Schwitzgebel is right, in the last quoted passage, that introspection is not nearly as powerful as vision. But vision is widely recognized to be especially powerful among the external senses. Introspection strikes me as equally powerful as, say, olfaction: we do discern, through introspection, the phenomenal features of ongoing emotional experience with as much ease and confidence as we discern, through olfaction, the odors of nearby objects. More generally, although the Cartesian thesis that introspection is more reliable than (external) perception may indeed be an overreach, the following thesis seems to me to survive Schwitzgebel's present critique: introspection is as reliable as non-visual perception.[4] This weaker thesis may suffice to secure a role for introspection in a full science of the mind; more on that when we discuss Chapter 5.

The second case study in Chapter 7 concerns peripheral visual phenomenology. Here Schwitzgebel charges introspection with inaccuracy rather than ignorance. The naïve belief is that visual phenomenology in the periphery of the visual field is rich and sharp. In reality, it is sparse and blurry -- as can be appreciated from Dennett's (1991) Marylins and similar examples. Schwitzgebel concludes that naïve introspection produces false beliefs in this area. This mode of argument is used elsewhere in the book, most notably in Chapter 2, where Schwitzgebel argues that perception of tilted coins typically involves a circular rather than elliptical phenomenology, but we often form an introspective belief to the contrary 'due to over-analogizing visual experience to flat media' (p. 24)

Again, however, we may wonder whether it is introspection proper that is at fault, or some bit of cognition occurring after it, or in parallel to it and trumping it.[5] Consider Schwitzgebel's own diagnosis of how the error about peripheral visual phenomenology arises:

Here is the root of the mistake, I suspect: When the thought occurs to you to reflect on some part of your visual phenomenology, you normally move your eyes (or "foveate") in that direction. Consequently, wherever you think to attend, within a certain range of natural foveal movement, you find the clarity and precision of foveal vision. (p. 126)

This diagnosis is quite plausible. But the fallacy it designates is one of reasoning, not introspecting: the direct encounter with the visual phenomenology one is introspecting at any one point is indeed one of a rich and sharp phenomenology, since it is an encounter with focal rather than peripheral phenomenology. It is the inference we make from this sequence of accurate introspections that is fallacious: reason fails to take into account the way in which attending to each part of the visual field changes its phenomenal features from when it was unattended; it therefore performs an induction on a systematically biased sample.[6] Likewise for the case of shape phenomenology: (over-)analogizing is not something introspection does, it is something reason does! Here again it strikes me that it is folk theorizing about introspection (and/or from introspection) that goes wrong, not the introspecting itself.

There may be a terminological discord here between Schwitzgebel's use of the term 'introspection' and mine. I am using the term to denote just the quasi-perceptual process whereby we encounter (in some admittedly problematic sense) our phenomenal states, and in such a way as to exclude inferences made on the basis of such encounter. Schwitzgebel appears to use the term more inclusively to denote whatever process turns out to be 'the primary method by which we normally reach judgments about our [relevant] experience' (p. 120).[7] In this more liberal usage, a two-step process involving (i) quasi-perceptual encounter with phenomenology and (ii) inference from the deliverances of such encounter would qualify as fully introspective. In my more restricted usage, it would count as a partially introspective process; only a process exhausted by (i) would qualify as fully introspective. I would gladly concede that introspection in the more liberal sense is indeed less reliable than non-visual perception. But this is consistent with introspection in the narrower, quasi-perceptual sense being as reliable as non-visual perception and therefore as legitimate an instrument for the study of the phenomena it acquaints us with (other things being equal). In what follows, I will keep using 'introspection' in the narrower sense, and will use 'self-understanding' (doubtless sub-optimally) for the wider notion.[8] With this terminological regime in place, we can safely assert that some folk opinions on visual phenomenology are not introspective opinions, in the sense that they are not opinions formed by the introspective 'faculty' solely (or at all), and so their inaccuracy does not reflect in any way on the reliability of introspection.[9]

Finally, Schwitzgebel argues that the inability to reach consensus, even among experts, on the existence of cognitive phenomenology is evidence that introspection is extremely weak and misleading: at least one side of the debate must be badly mistaken about a fairly central feature of their stream of consciousness.[10] He writes:

But introspection of current conscious experience is supposed to be easy, right? Thoughts occupied us throughout the week, presumably available to be discerned at every moment, as central to our lives as the seminar table. If introspection can guide us in such matters -- if it can guide us, say, at least as reliably as vision -- shouldn't we reach agreement about the existence or absence of a phenomenology of thought as easily and straightforwardly as we reach agreement about the presence of the table? (p. 128)

This mode of argument also recurs in the book. A particularly acute example is Chapter 3, where Schwitzgebel argues that 'people's differences in self-report generally fail to reflect whatever underlying differences there might be in their imagery' (p. 52) on the grounds that the variation across such reports is astounding.[11]

However, introspectionists may respond simply by trimming expectations. Imagine a race of creatures who possess only one external sense, a sense of smell just as powerful as that of normal humans, with which they must navigate an environment just like ours -- nay, lusher. Importantly, let us stipulate that their olfactory sensitivity does not increase over time to levels higher than ours (as it would in a blind human, say). These creatures' perceptual capacity is limited, but not quite worthless. They can tell a muffin from a brick, but cannot tell a dozen muffins from a baker's dozen. Suppose now that scholars among them raise the issue of whether forest gardenias merely have the generic odor of Hawaiian gardenias or instead boast a proprietary odor involving an ever so subtle tone unique to it. Certainly in the first decade of the debate one can expect only acrimony. Consensus may arise a hundred years thence; but even if it does not, the creatures' reaction should simply be that the question is difficult, not that their sense of smell is systematically unreliable. In the meantime, they may soundly suppose that some among them are better smellers than others, and that those who are will emerge as research advances.

This thought-experiment suggests to me that the lack of consensus on the existence of cognitive phenomenology should be an embarrassment to the thesis that introspection is infallible or near-infallible, but not to the thesis that it is as reliable as non-visual perception; similar remarks apply to the imagery case.[12] Again it appears to be the theory of introspection that is especially misleading, not introspection itself. The culprit may be the theory that introspection is near-infallible, or that introspectors enjoy absolute first-person authority over their phenomenology, or that introspection ought to be (in Schwitzgebel's words) easy, or some such theory. Ironically, it is precisely attachment to an overly Cartesian picture of introspection that inspires skepticism about introspection. As long as we expect introspection -- for Locke, the 'inner sense' -- to be just as reliable as the average (as opposed to the outstanding) external sense, we are less likely to be disappointed.

None of this is intended to diminish what is accomplished in this chapter of the book. It is still an important point that our self-understanding is much more confused and inaccurate than we like to think, and Schwitzgebel establishes that indeed it is, at least to my satisfaction. He would also be right that our standard theory of introspection casts it as more reliable than, say, olfaction, and that introspection's equi-reliability with non-visual perception would be a humbling lesson for most of us. Thus Schwitzgebel considers the option of restraining our expectations, as per the above suggestion, and responds that 'such restraint hardly seems natural' (p. 136) -- which seems right. What I am resisting is merely the chapter's overarching thesis: that a full understanding of the mind requires introspection but introspection is not up to the task. My contention is that introspection can be perfectly useful for the study of the mind -- about as useful as olfaction is for the study of matter.[13] Furthermore, just as our sense of smell can be honed through well-informed training, so could our introspective acuity. If so, it is false that 'the restraining move deprives introspection of most of its philosophical and psychological value' (ibid.). Suitably heightened introspective sensitivity could function as a source of (some) reliable observations of (some) psychological phenomena. This was the guiding idea of introspectionist psychologists, most notably Titchener himself, who composed a 1600-page manual for training introspection. This manual is the topic of Chapter 5, to which we now turn.[14]

Titchener was essentially in agreement with Schwitzgebel on the unreliability of naïve introspection; indeed, he often patiently detailed the great variety of pitfalls stalking untutored introspecting. It was his hard-nosed empiricist attitude to science that convinced him of the indispensability of introspection: all natural science starts from observation, he claimed, and introspection is our only mode of observing mental phenomena. Thus studying mental phenomena while refusing to introspect them is like studying zebras while refusing to look at them. It is unlike studying leptons and quarks without observing them: leptons and quarks cannot be observed, so we must theorize about them on the basis of inference from observation of other phenomena; but zebras and conscious episodes are observable, so studying them purely by inference from observation of other entities would be perverse. Thus studying phenomenology purely on the basis of observing overt behavior and neural activity -- which is what post-introspectionist psychology effectively does -- is a case in point. As noted, however, the indispensability of introspection was a source of anxiety for Titchener, as he was acutely aware of the various pitfalls attending it. His manual is essentially an attempt to introduce a performance/competence distinction for introspection and institute strict standards of introspective competence as prerequisites for scientific admissibility.

Schwitzgebel appears cautiously sympathetic to this sort of gambit. His discussion in Chapter 5 concentrates on the difficulties involved in fashioning introspective competence à la Titchener, but one gets the sense that he genuinely wishes that some kind of introspective training could be feasible and profitable.[15] Yet the main mandate of the chapter is to voice skepticism about the project's prospects. Schwitzgebel again considers three case studies -- three different exercises from Titchener's manual (to do with introspection of 'combination tones,' the 'flight of colors' experience, and visual illusions) -- and raises a variety of difficulties regarding their interpretation and implementation. One skeptical theme runs through the chapter and concerns the independence of phenomenology from introspection. The worry is that one's introspection can affect one's phenomenology in a top-down sort of way. Thus one's phenomenology may in truth lie at least partly downstream of introspection and its theoretical 'baggage.' It is natural to worry that, if this is so, introspectionist training would only exacerbate this particular challenge to the trustworthiness of introspection. After indulging one of Titchener's exercises, Schwitzgebel confesses:

Although my own introspections of the experiences produced by figure 5.2 [a certain figure from Titchener's manual, affording possible Gestalt shifts] were initially rather disorganized, I find them now mostly to conform to the pattern Titchener describes. But I am not sure whether I am now judging my experience of the figures more accurately or whether accepting Titchener's generalization has altered my experience. (pp. 85-6)

The question arising here is whether it is genuinely possible to alter (e.g., sharpen) one's introspective faculty without also altering the phenomenology it is used to inspect. On certain (broadly Cartesian) views, there is a constitutive connection between how phenomenology is and how it appears to introspection.[16] If this is right, then certainly change in the introspection would entrain change in the introspected. But even if the connection between phenomenology and introspection is merely causal and contingent, our cognitive architecture might be set up in such a way that, in many circumstances, changes in the introspective faculty tend to lead to changes in the phenomenology. Either way, the prospects for using trained introspection to study pre-training phenomenology seem bleak.

I think this is a real worry. It should be noted that the original introspectionists were well aware of it: it is with this in mind that Müller (1911) distinguishes between 'free' and 'controlled' consciousness, and Titchener (1912) warns against hasty generalizations from phenomenology as affected by introspection or introspective intent ('controlled consciousness') to phenomenology as it is independently of introspection ('free consciousness').[17] Yet neither offers a clear recipe for justifiable extrapolation. Perhaps the hope is that the infiltration of phenomenology by introspection would be a limited phenomenon. Certainly questions concerning the existence of certain types of phenomenology seem safe. For instance, if trained introspectors converged on a consensus that cognitive phenomenology exists, it would be implausible to suggest that this phenomenology does not exist prior to training and that it is somehow brought into existence by introspective competence.[18] Thus we can look to introspective competence for help in producing as comprehensive an inventory of phenomenal features as possible. The competence does not obscure the existence of phenomenology; at most, it obscures its character (which of several similar phenomenal features is normally instantiated by some kind of pre-training episode, what specific combinations of phenomenal features tend to cluster together, and so on). These more involved questions rarely arise in a philosophical context, however, though they are crucial for a comprehensive psychology.[19]

One way to approach the limitations on our sense of smell is to train our nose. But another is to present the untrained nose with particularly odorous versions of the objects of interest. Likewise, honing our introspection to discern more capably phenomenal experiences is only one approach to the limitations of naïve introspection. The other is presenting introspection with particularly vivid or intense versions of phenomenologies of interest. For example, in ongoing research on the phenomenology of freedom, I have collected unprompted descriptions of the experience of freedom by subjects in whom these were likely felt with particular vivacity and acuity: freed prisoners, emancipated and manumitted slaves, liberated concentration camp survivors, freed abductees, and so on.[20] The merits of this alternative methodology are a matter for separate discussion. But if the deliverances of this sort of research, founded on intensified phenomenology, could be brought into reflective equilibrium with deliverances of a properly developed introspectionist psychology, founded on heightened introspective sensitivity, the result should surely be treated as more trustworthy than naïve introspection of standard-intensity phenomenology.

For that matter, there is no reason why we should not seek to bring these two sources of evidence into reflective equilibrium also with behavioral and neural evidence, such as studies in Frank Tong's laboratory attempting to decode phenomenal experience from neural activity (Kamitani and Tong 2005). Although some introspectionists were bullish about introspection being the only legitimate source of evidence, the claim Schwitzgebel is interested in is much more modest: that introspection is a legitimate source of evidence for, and thus has a role in, a scientific understanding of the mind. This thesis is vindicated if we agree, as I think we should, that scientific understanding of a type of phenomenology P is benefited by calibrating neural and behavioral evidence about P with evidence gathered from specially trained introspection of regular instances of P and untrained introspection of particularly vivid instances of P.[21]

To summarize, the book's official thesis -- that introspection is unreliable -- is somewhat ambiguous. I was persuaded by Schwitzgebel's argumentation that introspection is not as reliable as our folk theory/conception of introspection imagines or as certain philosophers of a strong Cartesian bent maintain. I was not persuaded, however, that introspection is less reliable than sense perception, except in comparison with visual perception. In other words, the thesis that introspection is as reliable as non-visual perception seems to me to survive the book's argument; call this the 'thesis of introspection's equi-reliability with non-visual perception,' or the 'equi-reliability thesis' for short. Furthermore, this suggests that, just like sense perception, introspection can be honed, and its sensitivity to its 'environment' heightened, so that its reliability increases, potentially to a level where its deliverances would be scientifically admissible. All that said, there is one other thing the book managed to persuade me of: introspection is less reliable than I thought it was. To that extent, reading the book has been extremely instructive and certainly sharpened my own thinking on introspection.


Dennett, D.C. 1991. Consciousness Explained. Boston: Little, Brown, and Co.

Kamitani, Y. and F. Tong 2005. 'Decoding the visual and subjective contents of the human brain.' Nature Neuroscience 8: 679-685.

Kriegel, U. 2007. 'The Phenomenologically Manifest.' Phenomenology and the Cognitive Science 6: 115-136.

Kriegel, U. Forthcoming. The Varieties of Consciousness: Essays on Non-Sensuous Phenomenology. Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.

Müller, G.E. 1911. Zur Analyse der Gedächtnistätigkeit und des Vorstellungsverlaufes [On the Analysis of Memory Activity and Imaginative Process]. Leipzig: Barth.

Schwitzgebel, E. Forthcoming. 'Introspection, What?' In D. Smithies and D. Stoljar (eds.), Introspection and Consciousness. Oxford: Oxford UP.

Titchener, E.B. 1912. 'The Schema of Introspection.' American Journal of Psychology 23: 485-508.

Watson, J.B. 1913. 'Psychology as the Behaviorist Views It.' Psychological Review 20: 158-177.

[1] At the same time, Schwitzgebel's is not intended as a precise thesis. It clearly is intended to entail that introspection is fallible and clearly is not intended to entail that introspection never produces true beliefs or never grounds justified ones; but it is also meant to be significantly nearer the latter end of the reliability spectrum. In any case, in addition to the official thesis there appears to be also an unofficial thesis implicit throughout the book: that introspective impressions often lie downstream of one's general theory of (and engagement with) one's experience and the world at large, and are thus heavily theory- and practice-laden. I will touch on closely related themes occasionally, but will address myself primarily to the official thesis.

[2] He writes: 'There are two kinds of unreliability. Something may be unreliable because it often goes wrong or yields the wrong results, or it may be unreliable because it fails to do anything or to yield any result.' (p. 135)

[3] The same response applies also to the argument of Chapter 4, where Schwitzgebel argues that, contrary to naïve belief, humans can in principle (and sometimes do in practice) echolocate. Beliefs about what can and cannot be done cannot be based solely on introspection, but must involve inference from individual introspections. Introspection proper tells us what our concurrent experience is like, not what it can or cannot be.

[4] Here too, then, it is theorizing about introspection that I am inclined to impugn for Schwitzgebel's claim that introspection is less reliable than external perception -- the theorizing, more specifically, that expects a perceptual or quasi-perceptual faculty to be as reliable as vision.

[5] One could reject, of course, the claim that an intelligible, or useful, distinction can be drawn between introspective and post-introspective processes in the formation of beliefs about conscious experience. Indeed, this may well be Schwitzgebel's (forthcoming) considered position. I leave discussion of this move for another occasion.

[6] Furthermore, it is not clear that the naïve introspector has any beliefs about peripheral visual phenomenology. When she is asked to answer questions about it, she may be forming the belief for the first time, and doing so on any number of bases other than direct introspection of her concurrent visual phenomenology. General expectations may be at play, a certain pride about the 'quality' of her phenomenology may be operative, and so on.

[7] I do not have a firm sense that Schwitzgebel's use of the term is indeed different from mine in this way, but I wish to consider this possibility just in case.

[8] Correspondingly, I will reserve the term 'introspective belief' for beliefs based entirely on fully introspective processes. This is intended to be analogous to our usage of 'perceptual belief.' (Compare: my belief that my laptop is silver is a perceptual belief, but my belief that laptops are often silver, white, or black is not; this is because the former is based solely on perceptual encounter, and plausibly is formed simply by endorsement of the content of perception, whereas the latter implicates post-perceptual inferences/reasoning.) If it is thought not be analogous to our usage of 'perceptual belief,' it would at least be analogous to something like 'purely perceptual belief.'

[9] A plausible example of this is the belief -- the linchpin of Chapter 1's argument -- that we dream in black-and-white, apparently rife among the folk in America between the 1930s and the 1960s. Schwitzgebel notes a correlation between the preponderance of this belief and the prominence of black-and-white media in 1930s-1960s America. The best explanation of the correlation, he claims, is not that people's dreams have changed in this period (they were just as colored, perhaps, or just as indeterminate as between color and black-and-white, as before and after), but the prominence of black-and-white media perverted people's beliefs about their dreams. Here it seems fairly clear that the relevant belief was not formed by introspection, but by certain much more cognitively involved processes comprising inter alia social and cultural cognition. Introspection could still be faulted for not withstanding such cultural infiltration, but that is not quite the same as faulting it for producing the belief in question. Furthermore, it could be argued that the whole episode does not impugn introspection as operative in teleologically normal circumstances. Our introspective faculty evolved in a colorful environment and thus was not designed to operate in an environment saturated with black-and-white stimuli. Perhaps as a result, when our cognitive system is abnormally bombarded by black-and-white stimuli, the introspective faculty is liable to be confused and consequently unreliable. This is consistent with introspection being perfectly reliable in teleologically normal circumstances.

[10] The point arises also earlier in the book (circa p. 39), in the context of discussing the Gestalt psychologists' controversy regarding 'imageless thoughts.' As Schwitzgebel notes, the only way introspection could be seen as reliable across the board is if disputants simply have a different phenomenal life -- some have a proprietary cognitive phenomenology and some do not -- but this is highly implausible.

[11] Another example is Chapter 1, where Schwitzgebel argues that 'at least some people must be pretty badly mistaken about their dreams' (p. 7), notably about whether their dreams are colored or black-and-white, partly on the grounds that at different times and places people systematically held different views on the matter.

[12] The dream case strikes me as importantly different, and I will discuss it in later notes.

[13] There is an important question as to why our self-understanding should be so surprisingly poor, and a suspicion might arise that it is precisely introspection that perverts our self-understanding. My sense, however, is that there are much more plausible culprits. Discussion of the matter would take us too far afield, so I will not delve into this here, but see the introduction to Kriegel (forthcoming).

[14] On introspectionists' suspicion of untutored introspection, the following tidbit from Schwitzgebel is illuminating: 'Wundt was reputed not to have admitted data from observers who hadn't performed at least 10,000 laboratory introspections.' (p. 74)

[15] He writes: 'if accurate introspection is difficult, one might expect training to produce substantial benefits. It is plausible that a trained introspector would at least, as Titchener says, better maintain consistent attention, know better what to look for, and deploy more sophisticated concepts for describing complex experiences.' (p. 90)

[16] On the other hand, a constitutive connection between introspection and phenomenology could salvage some of the reliability of naïve introspection -- depending on the exact connection. Consider a view of consciousness according to which the qualitative character of a visual experience, say, is determined by the concepts used to represent that experience in a higher-order thought, a higher-order thought that could become an introspective belief at any moment with just a slight act of attention-shifting. On this view, whether we dream in color or in black and white, say, depends ultimately on whether the relevant higher-order thoughts represent our dreams with color concepts or black-and-white. This allows us to claim that during the prominence of black-and-white media, including in America of the 1930s-1960s, our cognitive system was so affected by the media that it produced importantly different higher-order thoughts (of the right kind) than before or after; in particular, it was prone to produce higher-order thoughts about dream experiences that represented them as black-and-white. This would undermine Schwitzgebel's claim in Chapter 1 that dreams must have had the same qualitative character, in respect of color, during that period as before and after it -- a claim central to his argument, in that chapter, that dream introspection is unreliable.

[17] Titchener (1912: 493) writes: 'A conscious state or process is free when it is neither evoked nor influenced by the intent to observe; it is controlled when it arises under the influence of an introspective intent and as the object of a consequent attention especially directed upon it. We have, plainly, no right to generalise a priori from the controlled to the free; whenever generalisation is made, it must be justified by a statement of its methodological grounds.'

[18] The converse possibility is more realistic -- that there exist types of phenomenology which introspective competence annihilates -- and that would indeed represent a limitation on introspectionist psychology. But the fact that introspectionist psychology could not teach us of everything is not itself a reason to refuse any of its teachings. Thus, perhaps young infants experience a phenomenology no adult can experience or remember (this is not altogether implausible). This would mean we could never know about such a phenomenology. But we would not infer that there is therefore no point in studying standard color phenomenology, say.

[19] Philosophical debates about phenomenology tend to focus on which phenomenologies exist, not so much on what the character of various conscious experiences is. For relevant discussion, see Kriegel (2007).

[20] These were taken from public interviews, slave narratives, survivor testimonials, memoirs, and so forth -- materials I had no role in prompting.

[21] Thus, suppose we are presented with two theories of P -- T1 and T2 -- such that one is based on neural and behavioral evidence only while the other incorporates those two kinds of introspective evidence as well. If the theories are inconsistent with each other, this means that introduction of introspective evidence has had an impact on the theory. My claim is that, where all four types of evidence were gathered competently, we should adopt the theory which uses all four rather than that which uses only the neural and behavioral evidence. This claim is all the vindication of introspection I seek.