Persistence Through Time, and Across Possible Worlds

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Jiri Benovsky, Persistence Through Time, and Across Possible Worlds, Ontos Verlag, 2006, 281pp., $115.95 (hbk) ISBN 3937202994.

Reviewed by Heather Dyke, University of Otago


This is a book based on the fact that analogies are there to be drawn between theories about time and theories about possible worlds. But it is not a book about those analogies. Benovsky draws up a single procedure for approaching the two realms, and then follows that procedure in each of them in turn. The result is an interesting and thorough tour through much of the contemporary debate surrounding the issues of time and persistence on the one hand, and possible worlds and modal 'persistence' on the other.

Benovsky's approach is very systematic. An interesting indication of this is given by his intriguing table of contents. It consists of two 'maps' of the available positions with respect to time and modality. On the temporal 'map' we have, on the left hand side, views about the nature of time: Eternalism and Presentism. Along the top we have the different ways objects can persist: Perdurantism and Endurantism. This gives rise to four occupiable positions where each of these views intersect. These are four-dimensionalism, including both 'stage' and 'worm' variants, presentist perdurantism, eternalist endurantism, and presentist endurantism. At the points of intersection Benovsky lists the advantages of and objections to each view that he discusses in the book, with chapter references.

The modal 'map' is slightly more complicated, as there are three views about possible worlds (Fictionalism, Abstractionism and Modal Realism) which intersect with three different ways objects can modally 'persist' (Trans-world identity, Counterpart theory, and Modal Perdurantism). It should be noted that Benovsky uses the term 'modal perdurants' to refer to what Lewis calls trans-world individuals (Lewis 1986, §4.3). Benovsky first discusses the pros and cons of the views about possible worlds independently of the views about modal 'persistence'. He then explores the combinations of these theories with the different views about modal 'persistence'.

Benovsky surveys and evaluates the metaphysical landscape using a number of meta-theoretical guidelines: internal consistency, explanatory power, intuitiveness, parsimony, compatibility with current science, and honesty (9). Ultimately he opts for analogous views in both the temporal and modal domains. The temporal view is the 'worm view' version of four-dimensionalism, according to which objects persist through time by being spread out along the temporal dimension, just as they are spread out in the three spatial dimensions, and thus by having temporal parts that exist at different times. The modal view he favours is a theory of modal perdurants, according to which objects are modally 'spread out', and have modal parts occupying different possible worlds (10).

The book would be suitable for use by graduate and upper-level undergraduate students of philosophy. It provides good coverage of many of the contemporary views about time, persistence and modality, so would be useful as a text in a graduate course on those issues. Benovsky clearly presents the views he discusses, and outlines their advantages over their rivals, as well as existing objections to them. Given the systematic way in which this is done, mentioned above, it would be ideal for familiarising students with the existing state of the philosophical literature on these topics.

There is no doubt that there are analogies between time and modality, and between available treatments of these topics. But how far should we push these analogies, and to what purpose? Benovsky's title suggests that he wants to push it as far as he can. He talks of objects persisting across possible worlds, suggesting that this is analogous to persisting through time. It's not clear to me that any real sense can be made of persisting across possible worlds independently of the temporal analogy. We certainly have no experience of modal persistence that parallels our experience of temporal persistence, aside from wondering how things might have gone differently for us, which is quite different from experiencing ourselves and objects around us exist over time and survive change. Furthermore, the two are disanalogous insofar as our self-interest does not extend to our counterparts, but does to other temporal stages of ourselves. This suggests to me that the term 'modal persistence' is simply a term of art introduced to describe that phenomenon, whatever it is, that is the modal analogue of temporal persistence. Perhaps this is acceptable, since there surely is such a phenomenon discussed by metaphysicians, and there is no other neutral term available for it. 'Trans-world identity' and 'counterpart theory' are theory-laden terms that refer to particular ways of cashing out the modal analogue of temporal persistence, whatever that is. But if that is what we are doing when we talk of modal persistence, then we should make it clear that we are co-opting the term from the temporal domain to perform this function in the modal domain, rather than assuming it already makes sense in the modal domain, which is what Benovsky tends to do. For example, when describing the theory of modal perdurants he writes,

the friend of modal perdurants claims that such objects are also extended across possible worlds and exist at different worlds by having different parts there … Objects … thus genuinely persist across possible worlds. (153)

Despite the methodical approach, there are some regions of the metaphysical terrain left unmapped by Benovsky. His discussion of the available views about the nature of time is limited to Presentism and Eternalism, thus ignoring 'growing block' theories, such as that defended by Tooley (1997), according to which past and present times exist, but future times don't; and 'branching tree' theories such as that defended by McCall (1994), according to which the future exists as a realm of branching possibilities. He also ignores A-theoretic variants of Eternalism, which maintain that all times exist, but there is, nevertheless, a genuine distinction between past, present and future times. Views like this are discussed by, for example, Bigelow (1993), and Parsons (2002). It's possible that the ways in which objects persist through time, which are Benovsky's real focus, would not be sensitive to the differences between these views and the views he does examine, but some recognition that this had been considered would have been welcome. On the modal side, Benovsky restricts himself to considering views about the nature of possible worlds, but this means that some important approaches to modality are left out. There is no discussion of conventionalism, anti-realism or modalism, for example. A line of thought that might have been worth pursuing is the question of whether a modal view analogous to the stage variant of four-dimensionalism would be viable, and if so, fruitful. However, to his credit, Benovsky does discuss very recent developments in these fields that have not, so far, received much attention in the literature. An example of this is his discussion of Parsons on entending (63-66) (Parsons 2000).

There is, however, one view about possible worlds discussed here that is, insofar as it is a developed metaphysical theory about possible worlds, by and large an original one, although such a view is considered by Lewis (1986, 207-209). This is the dynamic, or branching structure of possible worlds that he discusses, and ultimately rejects, in chapter 5 of Part II. In order to grasp this view we are to

suppose that the world has a beginning and that all possible worlds share it -- they all have the same origin. From that moment, and at every moment of time since then, it was possible for the world to evolve in many different ways. (138)

Each of the complete ways the world could have evolved then constitutes a possible world. This is an interesting view, designed to overcome some specific problems with Lewis's modal realism. One problem facing Lewis is the Kripke/Plantinga objection that counterpart theory is unable to account for our commonsense beliefs that things might have gone differently for me, rather than merely in fact going differently for some counterpart of me, who is causally and spatiotemporally isolated from me. The branching model of possible worlds, it is claimed, overcomes this objection because the actual world and the world in which things go differently for me share an earlier world stage before splitting, so the inhabitants of those worlds were once numerically identical. In this way, I can legitimately say that things might have gone differently for me.

Benovsky acknowledges a potential problem for this view, which derives from its requirement that all worlds share a common origin, and thus that all counterparts of individuals share a common origin. He notes that it would not be possible, on this view, to say truly that 'I could have been a monk living in the 12th Century' (148). His response is to accept that the view couldn't account for possibilities like this, and then to defend the theory by suggesting that such possibilities are not really genuine possibilities. The view is thus similar to that suggested by Shoemaker (1998, 69-70). However, in the context of Benovsky's discussion, this response strikes me as unsatisfactory because it trades on different senses of what's possible, and these different senses are never made explicit. Given my actual biological origins I couldn't have been a monk living in the 12th Century, but the possible worlds apparatus is supposed to enable us to account for even very remote possibilities, such as worlds in which individuals exist who do not exist in the actual world, and even worlds containing just two particles. Even those who believe in the essentiality of origin recognise such worlds. This indicates a deeper problem with this view, which is that there are logically possible worlds that do not share a common origin with the actual world. So as a metaphysical theory of possible worlds, it should at least be acknowledged that, and how, this is a very restricted theory.

As I noted above, Benovsky ultimately rejects branching possible worlds. This too is puzzling. He spends most of Part II Chapter 5 defending the theory against various objections, so one expects him to opt for this theory. But in the concluding section of that chapter he rejects it, citing three problems. These are: the problem of the necessity of a common origin for all possible worlds, which he had previously thought not to be insurmountable; a problem concerning how the view unifies possible worlds, since Lewis's option of using spatiotemporal interrelatedness is unavailable; and the view's heavy ontological commitments. The first of these problems struck me as the most serious, yet didn't seem to have similarly struck Benovsky in his discussion of it. The second is certainly problematic for the view, so it was strange that his discussion of it was confined to the concluding paragraphs. The third seemed the least problematic as, while heavy, its ontological commitments are significantly smaller than those of Lewisian modal realism. Ultimately, I was unpersuaded by his rationale for rejecting the view.

There is one last peculiar thing I would like to note about Benovsky's treatment of the branching model of possible worlds. It seems highly analogous to McCall's 'branching tree' model of time, so it is odd indeed that, in a book motivated by the analogies between time and modality, McCall's theory did not rate a mention in the discussion on time. There may well have been scope here for developing, not just a pair of analogous views about time and possible worlds, but a single, unified view that encompassed both. Existing work, such as that by Belnap et al (2001), may have helped with this.

In conclusion, Benovsky's book will be useful, particularly to graduate students, as a systematic survey of a range of views about time and possible worlds. Some drawbacks are that the writing is occasionally clumsy, and there is no index. More substantively, there is not much that is clearly original, but the coverage is thorough and clear. I also think it is a shame, given that the book is motivated by the analogies between time and modality, that Benovsky did not do more to explore these analogies, asking, perhaps, whether commitment to some view about temporal persistence would commit one to an analogous view about modal persistence. Instead, the material is presented more as two distinct projects within one book.


Belnap, N., Perloff M. and Xu M. (2001) Facing the Future: Agents and Choices in Our Indeterminist World. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Bigelow, J. (1991) 'Worlds Enough For Time', Noûs 25: 1-19.

Lewis, D. (1986) On the Plurality of Worlds. Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.

McCall, S. (1994) A Model of the Universe. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Parsons, J. (2000) 'Must a Four-Dimensionalist Believe in Temporal Parts?' The Monist 83: 399-418.

Parsons, J. (2002) 'A-theory for B-theorists', The Philosophical Quarterly 52: 1-20.

Shoemaker, S. (1998) 'Causal and Metaphysical Necessity', Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 79: 59-77.

Tooley, M., (1997) Time, Tense and Causation. Oxford: Clarendon Press.