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Christian Kanzian (ed.), Persistence, Ontos, 2008, 198pp., €79.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783938793749.

Reviewed by Thomas Sattig, Washington University


Debates about persistence are debates about the temporal profile of the material world. A standard debate concerns the nature of the persistence of ordinary objects, such as trees and tables. According to perdurantists, or four-dimensionalists, these objects persist through time by having different temporal parts at the various times of their existence. According to endurantists, or three-dimensionalists, ordinary objects persist without having a temporal part at each time of their existence; they persist, as it is often put, by being 'wholly present' at those times.

The aim of Christian Kanzian's anthology is to address various questions concerning persistence that reach beyond the standard debate between perdurantists and endurantists about ordinary objects. Among those questions are the following: Are there alternatives to the perdurantist and endurantist accounts of the nature of persistence of ordinary objects? What is the metaphysical role and status of criteria of persistence of objects of certain kinds? What are the nature and criteria of persistence of things other than ordinary objects? The eleven contributions to the anthology meet the aim of opening the floor to 'new arguments, new perspectives, and new theoretical backgrounds' with varying success. Some of the featured arguments and perspectives are new indeed, but many of them are not. Moreover, the contributions vary considerably in depth and clarity. At any rate, plenty of food for thought is provided.

Addressing the role of kinds, or sorts, in persistence, Jonathan Lowe offers an account of the ontological ground of the persistence conditions of objects of a given kind, while Edmund Runggaldier defends a sortally dependent form of endurantism in opposition to conventionalism about persistence. Concerning the relationship between the metaphysical profile of persisting objects, or continuants, and that of occurrents, or events, Johanna Seibt and Peter Simons each recommend an account of persistence that transcends the standard endurantism/perdurantism framework, whereas Pierre Grenon and Barry Smith offer an ontological pluralism about persistence within this framework. Furthermore, Steve Barker and Phil Dowe propose a new construal of endurantism in terms of haecceities. Arkadiusz Chrudzimski discusses the persistence of states, such as the state of a person's being in love. Ludger Jansen presents an account of the persistence of social entities, such as collectives, groups and institutions. Uwe Meixner attempts a rigorous ontological classification of material objects with respect to their spatial and temporal profile. Kristie Miller offers a discussion of the question whether existential intuitions are useful in metaphysical debates about composition. And Erwin Tegtmeier approaches persistence in the context of the ontology of time. In what follows, I shall take a closer look at the contributions by Jonathan Lowe and Peter Simons.

Lowe on persistence and essence

Each kind of material object has certain persistence conditions. What is the ontological source or ground of these persistence conditions? According to Jonathan Lowe, persistence conditions of objects of kind K are grounded in the essence of Ks. Here is a sketch of his picture.

Persistence conditions of objects of kind K, which determine how much change a K can survive, are consequences of a criterion of identity of objects of kind K, which specifies conditions under which objects x and y are numerically the same K. For example, x and y are the same lump of bronze iff 'x and y are maximal connected aggregates of exactly the same bronze particles' (p. 77). It is a consequence of this criterion that 'no lump of bronze can survive the loss or replacement of any of the bronze particles composing it' (ibid.).

Further, a criterion of identity of Ks is built into the concept of a K, such as the concept of a lump of bronze. It follows that concepts are individuative, encoding a qualitative tool for identifying and distinguishing the entities in the concept's extension. The central question for Lowe is how such a principle of individuation encoded in a concept is grounded. The answer, according to Lowe, is that a concept is an adequate way of thinking of those entities that make up the concept's extension, where adequacy consists in the accurate reflection of the essence of the relevant entities.

What are essences, according to Lowe? The essence of a K is what it is to be a K, which is a mind-independent fact of the matter, a joint in nature. Moreover, 'it is part of the essence of any material object to have certain causal powers that are not possessed individually by any of its material constituents' (p. 86). The latter condition is designed to rule out the existence of mere mereological sums of material objects, such as the sum of a lump of bronze and a live cat, on the grounds that the summation fails to generate any new causal powers. Hence, by accurately reflecting real essences the criteria of identity and persistence conditions encoded in concepts are grounded in a ready-made domain of objects with varied essences, instead of merely projecting a domain of objects onto an amorphous reality.

Presumably Lowe's interesting account of individuative concepts is meant to apply to our ordinary sortal concepts, including the concepts of a lump of bronze, of a cat, and of a mountain, to the effect that the latter accurately reflect a certain essence involving a robust causal component. I doubt that all our sortal concepts possess these features. Consider a body of land with two adjacent peaks, a northern one and a southern one. As Quine pointed out, it may be unclear whether there are two mountains or one. Given the close relationship between identity and number, numerical indeterminacy induces an indeterminacy concerning which criterion of identity the concept of a mountain encodes. Within Lowe's framework, this means that it is unclear which general mountain-essence the concept reflects, since criteria of identity are only grounded in essences if different criteria reflect different essences. This consideration threatens the thesis that our concept of a mountain accurately reflects a certain essence.

Setting the issue of accuracy aside, does the concept of a mountain reflect essences in Lowe's sense at all? If the concept of a mountain permits numerical indeterminacy -- one mountain or two? -- then it is plausible to say that distinct application conditions are equally suited candidates for being the application conditions of the concept of a mountain. According to the first candidate, c1, a mountain is a body of land with a single peak, in which case there are two mountains, since the body of land with the northern peak is a mountain, and the overlapping body of land with the southern peak is a distinct mountain. According to the second candidate, c2, a mountain is a body of land with the maximal sum of adjacent peaks, in which case there is one mountain, since the body of land with both the northern and southern peaks is a mountain, while none of the bodies of land with a single peak is a mountain. These different application conditions yield different criteria of identity, and should accordingly reflect different essences. The problem is that the only difference between c1 and c2 seems to be a matter of pure mereology without any robust causal undertones; individual peaks or sums of peaks, that is the only difference. According to Lowe, however, mereology alone is unsuited for delineating essences. Hence, our concept of a mountain may well fail to be grounded in essences as Lowe understands them.

Simons on persistence and invariance

Continuants are things that persist through time. Peter Simons asks how continuants persist, offering invariantism as an alternative to standard endurantism and perdurantism. Invariantism, like perdurantism, assigns four-dimensionally extended occurrents, entities that possess temporal parts, metaphysical priority, while invariantism, like endurantism, ascribes to continuants an ontological category distinct from occurrents. Simons' core idea is to view continuants as abstractions of inter-related occurrents. Here is a sketch of his picture.

As Frege pointed out, objects may be introduced by abstraction of an equivalence relation. For any equivalence relation E, aEb ⇔ §E(a) = §E(b), where the terms '§E(a)' and '§E(b)' designate an object that is 'internally related' to the equivalence E (p. 172). For example, a is equimassive to b ⇔ the mass of a = the mass of b. Simons calls objects thus introduced invariants. Invariants derive their attributes from the relata of the equivalence relation on which the invariants are based. Simons goes on to apply this Fregean apparatus to the metaphysical characterization of continuants. First of all, occurrents, such as physical, biological and psychological processes, are four-dimensionally extended in the sense of having temporal parts, and are metaphysically more basic than continuants, the things which we typically describe as the subjects of the mentioned processes, and which we typically describe as persisting through time. Furthermore, occurrents stand in certain cross-temporal equivalence relations, namely genidentity relations. These genidentity relations are causal and qualitative links between occurrents at different times. For example, an occurrent o taking place at time t stands in a certain biological genidentity relation with an occurrent o' taking place at another time t' just in case o and o' are causally linked occurrents with a certain biological specification. Continuants may then be characterized as the invariants of genidentity relations: occurrent o taking place at t is genidentical with occurrent o' taking place at t' ⇔ the continuant constituted by o at t is identical with the continuant constituted by o' at t'. The continuant thus introduced is 'intimately related', is based on, a certain genidentity relation. Accordingly, a continuant c derives all its attributes at various times from its underlying occurrents: c exists at t just in case c has a constituent occurrent that takes place at t; and c is located in spatial region r at t and has mass m at t just in case the sum of c's constituent occurrents at t is located in r and has mass m.

Simons claims that invariantism is superior to both endurantism and perdurantism. While his reasons are worth a closer look, I prefer to raise a problem for invariantism that Simons does not discuss. As Simons recognizes, any metaphysical account of continuants should attempt to sustain our ordinary conception of continuants and their qualitative profile. The intimate relation that continuants bear to occurrents and their qualitative profile, however, may require a massive revision of the folk conception of continuants. Genidentity relations are highly sensitive to the qualitative specification of occurrents, since genidentity is always genidentity in a certain respect, determined, for example, by certain physical, biological or psychological functions. As a consequence, genidentity relations are selective; they hold among a fairly restricted range of occurrents. According to Simons, continuants are abstractions of genidentity relations and borrow all their attributes at any time from the relata of their underlying genidentity relation. Since genidentity relations are selective, the range of attributes that a continuant based on this relation can possess is limited; too limited, I maintain.

Consider persons. If, as many philosophers hold, persons have psychological persistence conditions, then, within Simons' framework, persons are abstractions of genidentity holding between mental occurrents, as opposed to genidentity holding between biological occurrents. Moreover, persons derive their attributes from the attributes of the occurrents on which they are based. In general, a continuant abstracted from genidentity relation E can inherit an attribute from an occurrent o if and only if o is a relatum of E. Does this account capture the intuitive profile of persons? It seems not. We want to be able to say that a person exactly occupies a spatial region at t that includes the region exactly occupied by the person's arms and legs at t; we further want to be able to say that a person weighs 70 kg at t. If, however, a person is F at t just in case its constituent mental occurrents taking place at t are jointly F, then the person ends up with a very different spatial location and mass at t than expected, namely the joint location and mass of certain mental occurrents. This is an undesirable consequence of the claim that a person is an abstraction of a genidentity relation that is sensitive only to mental occurrents.

This problem is not restricted to persons. Say that an organism is an abstraction of a genidentity relation holding between occurrents with certain biological life-sustaining functions. Analogously to the case of persons, the selective nature of genidentity threatens to limit an organism's qualitative profile in unexpected ways. For we want to ascribe to an organism a rich set of attributes, including a certain spatial location and mass, that is not guaranteed to be derivable in its entirety from combinations of occurrents involved in life-sustaining functions.

The standard view on present matters seems to be that while certain mental occurrents play a role in the individuation of persons, and while certain biological occurrents play a role in the individuation of organisms, neither persons nor organisms are abstractions from, and hence constituted by, strings of occurrents. According to the standard view of persons, strings of genidentical mental occurrents are a mere guide to the temporal trajectory of the continuant, allowing persons to instantiate attributes other than the ones tied to these mental occurrents. That is, on the standard view, the relation between continuants and occurrents is less intimate than it is according to invariantism.