Person, Polis, Planet: Essays in Applied Philosophy

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David Schmidtz, Person, Polis, Planet: Essays in Applied Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2008, 260pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195365832.

Reviewed by Alan Holland, Lancaster University


Practitioners of applied philosophy will have reason to be grateful to David Schmidtz for assembling this collection of his recent papers. For now, when pressed by the often sceptical critic to explain what kind of thing it is, exactly, they (aspire to) do, they can refer with confidence to this collection. It is work of undoubted quality -- thoughtful, resilient and full of insight. At the same time, it addresses some of the most vexing questions that human agents face, yet in a thoroughly grounded fashion. And if the critic should return and say that she fails to see the difference between this, and 'ordinary' philosophy, such a response should come as no surprise. Schmidtz's central question -- 'what counts as a life well lived?' -- is as near as may be the same as Plato's: 'for our inquiry is not about some chance matter but about how we should live our lives' (Republic 344e). Here, then, is a prime example of how to continue 'the conversation that Plato began'.

The collection includes eleven revised versions of papers published over a period of sixteen years (1992-2008), one forthcoming paper, and one extracted from the author's Rational Choice and Moral Agency. Two of the essays are co-authored -- one with Sarah Wright, one with Elizabeth Willott.

A fuller version of Schmidtz's central question runs as follows: "What counts as a life well lived, a life worthy of aspiration, given that we live in a social and natural world?" (p.12). He further remarks that "[T]he essays collected here are steps toward forming an overall view about what it takes to live well in a world like ours". What we have then, by his account, is not so much an overall view, as steps towards that view. In consequence, if there is one (hardly serious) complaint to be made, it is that the reader -- and in this case the reviewer -- has to work quite hard to assemble the whole tapestry of which each essay constitutes more or less significant fragments. A further consequence is that one cannot be sure if one is assembling them in the order, and with the emphasis, that the author himself would give them.

That said, several of the key elements are clear enough. Perhaps the most important is given with the book's title. It is that we 'function', i.e. live our lives, in (at least) three different, though obviously interleaved, contexts -- those of person, polis and planet. This way of structuring our actual predicament at once indicates the potential richness of the life well lived, and also the potential challenges and tensions.

With characteristic restraint, and perhaps also because it does not fit easily into any of the standard categories (consequentialist, non-consequentialist and so forth), Schmidtz refrains from labelling the 'overall view' toward which he may be headed. The reviewer, on the other hand, need not, and perhaps should not, be so reticent. So if pressed, one might risk the term 'contextualist' as the least misleading description, as well as the one best capturing his overall approach. It is this 'contextualism', at any rate, which seems to me the source of much of the strength and subtlety that I find in Schmidtz's approach, and is expressed in one of the book's driving themes: "for the conclusions are meant to be about us, not about mathematically tractable caricatures of us" (p.33).

In the section headed 'Person', Schmidtz considers and rejects the maximising model of rational choice (ch.2, 'Choosing Strategies'), replacing it with an ideal of rational choice "that it would be natural and healthy for us to try to live up to" (p.34). On the way he makes an excellent job of sorting out the conceptual differences between satisficing and optimising. In 'Choosing Ends' (ch.3), which is one of the central essays of the whole collection, Schmidtz introduces the important notion of an "overarching and possibly unchosen maieutic end", namely "the end of finding things to live for" (p.45). A 'maieutic' end is explained as "an end achieved through a process of coming to have other ends". Armed with this notion he can explain how it is possible for an end to be rational and, if chosen, rationally chosen, when adopting it gives us something to live for (p.52). It also enables him convincingly to build morality into a life well lived. For as he argues in ch.4 ('Reasons for Altruism'), reflectively rational beings have reason to be other-regarding and to have integrity. Basically this is because both give us more to live for and indeed more that is worth living for, even if this takes us to the ultimate sacrifice since "concerns worth living for can become concerns worth dying for" (p.74). However, as he notes, having something to live for does not entail having something worth living for, since some people "go to war for the sake of having something to live for" (p.76).

One clear corollary of this line of reasoning is the dethroning of happiness, at least if happiness is construed as the ultimate goal of a life well lived. For Schmidtz, happiness is something to hope for, rather than something to live for. And if, as Aristotle remarks, we cannot choose to be happy, but we can, as Schmidtz wishes to insist, choose our ends, it will follow that happiness cannot be an end. But as Schmidtz further and astutely remarks, if someone says that they want to be happy one tends to think that they still have, and have so far failed, to find something to live for (p.59). One finds a similar sentiment in David Wiggins: "Suppose … someone looks to modern Utilitarianism for meaning or happiness. The theory points him towards the greatest satisfaction of human beings' desires. He might embrace that end … if he could see from his own case what satisfaction consisted in. But that is very likely where he started" (Wiggins p.135, italics added). Equally well observed, to my mind, is the importance that Schmidtz attaches both to feelings of competence and to the sense of challenge in determining whether or not a project in which we are engaged gives us something to live for. In addition, his emphasis on how the wisdom of the decisions we make, or the resolutions of conflict we agree to, depends on how well we 'grow into' (p.54) or 'live with' these decisions and resolutions is a welcome move away from caricature and toward reality.

The section headed 'Polis', in 'How to Deserve' (ch.6), continues some of the earlier themes as Schmidtz focuses on the importance of 'having a self worth caring about', and of 'becoming and remaining a self worth living for'. But his more particular aim is to make space within a theory of justice for the concept of desert. This he does by challenging the dominance of the backward-looking, or 'compensatory', notion of desert, and bringing into prominence a 'promissory' notion: "We sometimes deserve X on the basis of what we do after receiving X" (p.98). In this way Schmidtz begins to build a picture of what he regards as a desirable 'polis' or society. In assessing a society, he suggests, we should look not so much at whether its citizens get what they deserve, but at whether its citizens have the opportunity to deserve what they get (p.104). He notes without comment the absence of a parallel notion in the case of punishment. But in case this might seem to pose a theoretical problem, it is worth remarking on a different sort of parallel: treatment X that we feel we don't deserve (e.g. being passed over for a job), very often functions as a considerable incentive to prove that we did not deserve X.

The next essay, 'Moral Dualism', is perhaps the central paper of this second section. Its aim is to develop a conception of morality that 'leaves us room to breathe' -- by which he means room to live a humanly normal life that is not viewed as a compromise -- and that works at both the personal and interpersonal levels. The nature of the 'dualism' in question is that "we owe it to ourselves to nurture a good character, whereas we owe it to others to abide by social norms that serve the common good" (p.129). But, Schmidtz urges, the two strands can be seen as complementary parts of a unified theory. The key is to notice that one should pursue reflectively rational ends via means permitted by collectively rational social structures. So, morally, "one seeks to make oneself a better person -- a person with more to live for -- within constraints imposed by social structures that serve the common good" (p.138).

Ch.8, 'Separateness, Suffering, and Moral Theory', is a lively discussion of 'the Singer principle': that 'If it is in our power to prevent something bad from happening, without thereby sacrificing anything of comparable moral importance, we ought, morally, to do it'. In the name of the humanly normal life, Schmidtz demurs. "[F]amine relief's type-cost is not small. If we embrace the duty to relieve famine in the way Singer says we should, life does not just go on" (p.156). Now Singer may say 'nor should it!' But Schmidtz will say -- and here is where his 'contextualism' bites -- we must take care to think through what it is we may lose. For his understandable concern is that we may lose everything, including the capacity to help anyone. He declines to infer, however, that Singer's principle is wrong, preferring to reflect on what this means for the nature of moral theory. Singer's principle is a piece of theory and, since theories are maps, it is a piece of a map -- representative of the moral terrain, imprecise and loaded with compromise.

The challenge to the principle of the welfare state that is the topic of ch.10, 'Guarantees', though bracing, is possibly the most contentious essay, containing as it does a number of propositions that may strike the reader as dubious. Referring to Bill Clinton's claim that "we can't go back to the time when people were left to fend for themselves", Schmidtz asks, rhetorically, "what time was that … Did people roll over and die?" (p.183). Well, yes. John Corcoran, for one, whose case is so movingly described by Morrison I. Swift, as recounted by William James.[1] Moreover, in democratic societies in which welfare systems operate, these systems have presumably been voted for; so it is difficult to envisage the kind of situation that Schmidtz has in mind, where such a system is 'foisted on' people without their consent. No doubt a culture of dependency is not good for society as a whole and in the long run, but who knows whether "Like it or not, a lack of guarantees has been one of the great engines of human progress"? I venture that the author does not. And even if it were true, it would not follow that similar progress would not have been achieved without such an 'engine'. (Compare: 'Many medical advances have been achieved by means of vivisection'. It does not follow that they would not have been achieved in the absence of vivisection.) He favours instead the 'friendly society' approach on the grounds that this encourages people to internalize responsibility -- to take responsibility for meeting their own needs: "Medical savings accounts and privatised pension plans can help people to internalize … responsibility for their health care and their retirement". It is a moot (if perhaps unfair) point whether he would wish to repeat this today, when the rescue of so many such plans has been 'foisted upon' the unwilling taxpayer.

In the section headed 'Planet', Schmidtz develops some interesting ideas regarding the nature and role of property -- 'The Institution of Property' (ch.11) and 'Reinventing the Commons' (ch.12) -- assuming rightly that this is a fundamental aspect of our relationship with the land. His leading contention is that property institutions, by virtue of embodying the right to appropriate and the right to exclude, convert negative-sum games into positive-sum games, and therefore set the stage for society's flourishing as a positive venture. Furthermore, that the Lockean proviso permitting appropriation of the commons if a person can leave 'enough and as good' for others actually requires such appropriation under conditions of scarcity. At the same time, these conclusions are tempered by Schmidtz's contextualism, in this case the recognition that there are circumstances in which communal property regimes may work better than private ones.

In the two final essays, Schmidtz's contextualism again comes to the fore. The thesis of 'Natural Enemies' (ch.13) is that "those who embrace economic values and those who embrace preservationist values are not natural enemies" (p.237). He nicely caps the common sentiment that, on anthropocentric grounds, we have reason to think biocentrically, with the retort that, on biocentric grounds, we have reason to think anthropocentrically" (p.238). Schmidtz is too shrewd an economist to believe that land is simply a creature of the human economy. But he is also too shrewd an ecologist to believe that the human economy is simply a creature of ecology. Hence his view that "To ignore the logic of human economy is to ignore the logic of human ecology" (p.229) -- essentially because people's economic circumstances partly determine their ecological role. That said, it doesn't seem to me to follow that conflict resolution should focus on (economic) interests rather than on (value) positions (p.232); this is because the maintaining of certain values can be a large part of what people perceive to be their interests. In 'Are All Species Equal?', it is again Schmidtz's contextualist approach that enables him to show how we may reasonably adopt the attainable aim of respecting nature without having to adopt the unattainable aim of respecting all species equally. He presses hard the point that carrots hardly command the same respect as cows, or mice as chimpanzees. On the other hand it might be replied that the case is not so clear cut. For one could be said to show equal respect by showing appropriate respect, and appropriate respect might show itself in very different forms of treatment.

I conclude with two observations. One question that exercised me, especially during the earlier stages of reading, was why rationality plays such a fundamental role in Schmidtz's thinking. I disclaim any bias for or against such an emphasis, but simply wanted to understand its rationale better. If rationality is explained in terms of -- say -- the capacity to act for a reason, which could reduce in turn to the capacity to act, or the capacity for agency, one can see some reason for regarding it as central. And such an account would also do some justice to the age-old characterisation of humans as 'rational animals' and to associated doubts over whether non-human animals are rational. Furthermore, one can see that it is important to work on the connection between being moral and being rational if one is trying to answer the 'why be moral?' question (p.3). For Schmidtz, reflectively rational beings have reason to develop integrity and to have concern and respect for others, so if having integrity and having concern and respect for others are ways of being moral, then reflectively rational beings have reason to be moral (p.117). However, to say that one has reason to be moral is not the same as saying that being moral is always a matter of being rational. Moreover, even if it were, and even if, as Schmidtz appears to believe (as against Slote, for example), rationality always dictates that we choose the better option, it might be argued that being in a position to choose what is clearly the better option is actually the exception rather than the rule. And Schmidtz himself shows some recognition of this. "[G]oals we come to cherish as ends in themselves tend to become incommensurable", he writes (p.28). Hence we sometimes have no method by which to identify optimal trade-offs, and therefore no way of pursuing the goal of making life go as well as possible (p.29). Indeed, one might continue, life is not, after all, simply a 'pursuit'. Call it feeble-minded, but the ideal of a "thoroughly rational life plan" (p.56) does sound uncommonly strenuous. In a recent obituary of an acquaintance, it is said that he 'would do nothing unless he saw the point of it'. Whether that was an admirable quality is unclear, but one might be forgiven for thinking of it as mildly eccentric.

My second observation concerns the apparent absence from Schmidtz's writings of explicit reference to the emotions or to temperament. This is in stark contrast with Aristotle (and surprising, given the similarity of their projects) whose account of how we make ourselves fit to live in a polis makes reference to our managing of our emotional lives -- 'at the right time, in the right way and so forth' -- central. (Some cross-referencing with Burnyeat's 'Aristotle on Learning to be Good' could pay dividends here (Rorty, 1980).) Somewhat alarmingly, the one reference to the emotions that I noticed was in the context of 'emotional baggage' by which we are 'encumbered' (p.4). Perhaps Schmidtz simply does not see our inner lives in these terms. Or perhaps what we have here is an incipient critique of 'emotion-discourse'? Thus, on the one hand he describes devotion in telling terms. He remarks how final ends inspire a devotion and take on a life of their own. Hence we cannot simply wipe the slate clean -- "devotion does not work that way" (p.58). On the other hand, devotion is glossed, rather prosaically, as 'heavy investment' -- hardly applicable, for example, to the case of 'devoted' lovers. His fictional character Kate does not 'fall in love' but simply 'settles on a spouse'. Nor, when she loses her spouse in an accident, is she described as 'grief-stricken'. Rather, it is said that: "having lost her spouse … that part of her life is now empty, but it is not the same emptiness that once could have been filled by a process of choosing someone or other as a spouse". One is left with the slightly intriguing thought that here, too, the author is aiming for clarity and for the natural and the healthy, and that our 'emotion-discourse' is being judged perhaps insipid, or even empty. If so, it would be good to see this line of thought further developed.

It remains to say, in conclusion, and as I hope the above analysis and accompanying comment have made clear, that I found this an altogether satisfying, rewarding, and above all, challenging read.


Miles Burnyeat (1980) 'Aristotle on learning to be good', in A. O. Rorty (ed.) Essays on Aristotle's Ethics. University of California Press: Berkeley.

William James (1975) Pragmatism and The Meaning of Truth. Harvard University Press: Cambridge (MA) & London.

David Wiggins (1998) Needs, Values, Truth (3rd edn.). Clarendon Press: Oxford.

[1] Corcoran killed himself by drinking carbolic acid, having become too ill to work and support his wife and children (James, p.21).