Personal Identity and Ethics: A Brief Introduction

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David Shoemaker, Personal Identity and Ethics: A Brief Introduction, Broadview Press, 2009, 296pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781551118826.

Reviewed by Amy Kind, Claremont McKenna College


Although there are many excellent texts dealing with the metaphysics of personal identity, Shoemaker's Personal Identity and Ethics is the first book I know to tackle in such an extended way the question of the relationship between personal identity and our practical concerns. It is a very welcome addition to the philosophical literature. While even experts on the subject of personal identity will undoubtedly learn something new from this rich discussion, I expect the book's primary use will be in undergraduate (and perhaps graduate) classes, and its exceptionally clear presentation of some very thorny issues makes it an excellent choice for this purpose.

Shoemaker has divided his discussion of the relationship between personal identity and our practical concerns into two broad parts. The first half of the book focuses on our self-regarding practical concerns. Which theories of personal identity make it rational for us to anticipate an afterlife? More generally, when is it rational for someone to anticipate, or have self-regarding concern about, a future experience? The second half of the book focuses on other-regarding practical concerns. What light can theories of personal identity shed on ethical issues at the beginning of life, such as abortion, genetic intervention, and the creation of life through cloning? What light can they shed on ethical issues at the end of life, such as the legitimacy of advance directives? What can they tell us about the proper treatment (or "cure") in cases of multiple personalities? What role should theories of personal identity play in our assessment of moral responsibility? What is the relationship between personal identity and ethical theory, and in particular, do certain theories of personal identity make certain ethical theories more plausible?

Shoemaker's first chapter focuses on the question of whether an individual can survive the death of her body, and he frames his discussion around John Perry's Dialogues Concerning Personal Identity and Immortality. (Those adopting Shoemaker's book for classroom use would likely want to assign these Dialogues along with it.) He also introduces four different theories of personal identity -- the Soul Criterion, the Body Criterion, the Memory Criterion, and the Brain-Based Memory Criterion -- each of which is ultimately dismissed as inadequate. Though Shoemaker argues that the last three views suffer from serious problems that prevent them from being plausible accounts of our identity over time, he offers a different sort of argument against the Soul Criterion: There are good practical reasons to "insist on a tight connection between the nature of personal identity and our practical concerns, and thus reject any theory of personal identity -- like the Soul Criterion -- that denies this connection." (33) Even if souls exist, we lack any kind of epistemic access to them; rather, we reidentify individuals in terms of their bodies and/or their psychologies. Thus, souls are irrelevant to the practical issues under consideration, and this irrelevance is taken to justify the rejection of the Soul Criterion. Whether we're right to insist on such a tight connection between the nature of personal identity and our practical concerns is a question that recurs throughout the book, but which Shoemaker addresses in the concluding chapter. I'll return to this issue below.

In the second chapter, which deals primarily with the problem of when we can rationally have self-regarding concern about a future experience, Shoemaker discusses what he takes to be the "two most sophisticated theories of personal identity on offer" (112): the Psychological Criterion and the Biological Criterion, often called Animalism. Like the book as a whole, this chapter is admirably clear as it rehearses the standard considerations for and against each of the two views. Having argued that proponents of these criteria end up in a kind of stand-off -- each view faces a set of problems that are overall roughly equal in seriousness -- Shoemaker uses the third chapter to introduce two alternative approaches: the Narrative Identity Criterion and the Identity Doesn't Matter view (IDM).

Unlike the previous theories considered, the Narrative Identity Criterion proposed by Marya Schechtman aims to explain what makes an individual who she is rather than to offer a theory of her numerical identity over time. On this view, an experience or action can be properly attributed to an individual only if it is correctly incorporated into the self-told story of her life. This criterion seems tailor-made to account for our rational anticipation and self-concern; as Shoemaker puts it, "rational anticipation requires the kind of personhood and psychological unity that only narrative identity delivers." (95) However, Shoemaker suggests that the Narrative Identity Criterion fails to account for other practical concerns, such as our ability to reidentify other individuals, and sometimes has trouble even accounting adequately for rational anticipation and self-concern. When I am concerned about whether I will survive a medical procedure, for example, I may want to know whether whoever wakes up from that procedure will be me, a question that seems to depend on numerical identity. Finally, Shoemaker also suggests that the Narrative Identity Criterion suffers from some fundamental unclarities, for example, whether it is meant to be a prescriptive or descriptive theory. So, while he deems this alternative to traditional theories of personal identity worthy of our continued consideration, the view appears to face its own set of problems which are as serious as those of the Psychological Criterion or the Biological Criterion.

Shoemaker reaches a similar conclusion about IDM, Derek Parfit's view that what matters for survival is not identity but rather psychological continuity. Unlike identity, psychological continuity is not a 1:1 relation; an individual at time t1 may be psychologically continuous with two individuals at time t2. But, as Shoemaker explains, the IDM view claims that it can be rational for the first individual to anticipate both of the two later individuals' experiences, even though the first individual will be identical to neither of them:

What matters in ordinary survival -- what I look forward to in day-to-day survival -- is that the person who wakes up in my bed, say, will remember my life, act on my intentions, see and approach the world as I would have, love and take care of the things I love and take care of, and so forth. And whether or not there is one person or there are two people who will do this is -- at least to some extent -- unimportant. (107-8)

Furthermore, because psychological continuity comes in degrees, the IDM view implies that our practical concerns themselves may be matters of degree. For example, a teenager likely has considerably more psychological continuity with her middle-aged self than with her retirement-age self, so according to the IDM view, she should care more about her middle-aged self. Following Mark Johnston, Shoemaker criticizes the IDM view for this radical implication. The IDM view is motivated in large part by consideration of fission cases, which we never confront in real life. Thus, though there might be possible situations in which identity doesn't matter, given the actual situation in which we find ourselves, it seems reasonable for us to ground our practical concerns in facts about numerical identity.

The subsequent chapters on other-regarding concerns in the second half of the book suggest, however, that Shoemaker does not find this objection compelling. More generally, although Shoemaker aims to remain neutral throughout the book about which of the four contending theories (the Psychological Criterion, the Biological Criterion, the Narrative Criterion, and the IDM view) we should adopt, his discussion at times seems to betray a sympathy for the IDM view. In Chapters Four and Five, for example, after surveying various ethical issues concerning the beginning of life, Shoemaker reaches the tentative conclusion that whichever metaphysical theory turns out to be correct, there are no identity-based objections to the morality of practices such as abortion, stem cell research, genetic intervention, or cloning. This finding relates to a general strategic approach he cautiously recommends for dealing with ethical issues: "we might get more traction in applying metaphysics to morality if we perhaps focused less on identity per se and more on the direct psychological and physical relations in which identity might consist." (173) This strategy seems directly to favor the IDM view.

Consider also his rebuttal of Don Marquis' influential anti-abortion argument. On Marquis' view, the wrongness of killing an individual can be explained in terms of the value that her future has to her; he then argues that abortion is morally impermissible because a fetus has a valuable future just as we do. Against this, Shoemaker suggests we can best understand the value of an individual's future in terms of facts about her psychological continuity with her future self. In looking ahead to the future, I want someone to exist who is psychologically continuous with me -- who remembers my experiences, who will care about and carry out my current plans, and so on. Whether or not I am identical to that person is less important than whether she bears the right psychological relations to me. But if what matters for having a valuable future is psychological continuity, then fetuses cannot have valuable futures like ours; since they lack basic psychological capacities, they cannot have any psychological continuers. Thus, according to Shoemaker, Marquis' argument fails. Importantly, however, Shoemaker's discussion relies on intuitions about various hypothetical fission cases to motivate his claim about what makes our futures valuable, and someone disinclined to accept the IDM view might not share his intuitions about the fission cases -- or might, like Johnston, worry that these intuitions do not generalize. Though I myself am inclined to agree with Shoemaker's general line of response to Marquis, I do not always share his intuitions about the cases he uses to motivate this response, and I thus wish the discussion did not rely so heavily on those cases.

Chapter Six, which takes up questions about the legitimacy of advance directives and about the proper way to treat Dissociative Identity Disorder (DID), is to my mind one of the richest in the book. As Shoemaker himself notes, when DID is invoked in discussions of personal identity, it is usually in the context of the "one body/one person" principle. The distinct personalities of someone with DID, which may seem to correspond to distinct persons, pose a challenge to this principle. Shoemaker takes up a related but different issue, namely, that if these multiple personalities are distinct persons, then certain kinds of psychiatric treatments seem to be morally questionable. Attempts to eliminate some of the personalities, or even to integrate them, might be akin to murder. In Shoemaker's discussion of this issue, he manages to navigate through some difficult philosophical terrain without getting unnecessarily bogged down, and also without oversimplifying. I can easily see the material on DID stimulating lively conversation in an undergraduate class, perhaps in conjunction with the material on the Christine Beauchamp case in Kathleen Wilkes' Real Persons (which Shoemaker cites). I expect the discussion of advance directives would likewise make for compelling classroom dialogue. Though most of us share the strong intuition that an individual has the moral authority to dictate the terms of her future medical treatment, it turns out to be enormously difficult to find the grounds for that moral authority. Shoemaker's treatment of the issue does an excellent job of making this difficulty vivid.

This chapter also raises an intriguing methodological question -- namely, what role our moral intuitions should play in our evaluation of theories of personal identity. If a theory of personal identity cannot account for our intuition about the moral permissibility of advance directives, for example, then does this count against the theory? Or, if we have a theory that otherwise does quite well in accounting for personal identity, should we re-evaluate our intuition about advance directives? This general methodological question about the role of intuitions (which arises again in Chapter Eight, "Personal Identity and Ethical Theory") relates to another intriguing methodological question that recurs throughout the book, arising most prominently in Shoemaker's discussion of moral responsibility in Chapter Seven: "should we simply try to account for our practices as they are, or should we insist that our practices must depend on the metaphysical truth, whatever that turns out to be?" (238) These methodological questions, having been explicitly set aside for most of the book, are finally taken up in the concluding chapter, "Notes on Method." To my mind, however, this chapter falls a bit short of expectations. Given the importance of these methodological questions to the enterprise in which Shoemaker is involved, I had hoped that he would be able to provide more of a defense of his own methodological assumptions -- why, for example, certain intuitions that we have about practical concerns are treated as virtually untouchable.

It turns out that when we try to clarify our intuitions, as Shoemaker himself recognizes, they may turn out to be inconsistent -- or, even if they can be made consistent, it is still hard to see how they could all be compatible with a single theory of personal identity, or indeed, with a single theory of the relation between personal identity and ethics. I would have thought that this is a reason to reevaluate these intuitions, i.e., that we have compelling grounds to give some of them up, even if they are deeply held. But Shoemaker draws a different, and to my mind, surprising conclusion. In his view, we should adopt pluralism about the relation between identity and ethics, that is, we should accept "that there is no single relation between identity and ethics, but instead there are multiple relations, each depending on the methodological approach one takes to the relation." (283) If I understand what he means by this, however, it implies that there is no single correct criterion of personal identity. Rather, the question of numerical identity -- "is X at time t1 identical to Y at time t2?" -- is ambiguous; sometimes we mean X and Y qua agents, sometimes X and Y qua human animals, etc. Different practical concerns require us to read the question in different ways.

In his brief defense of pluralism, Shoemaker acknowledges that the view "is all fairly complicated, messy, and disunified." But, as he says, "it could well be that the truth about the relation between personal identity and ethics, like persons themselves, is complicated, messy, and disunified." (284) Though I recognize that we cannot always clean up the philosophical messes in which we find ourselves, I think we must be sure not to give up too easily. Particularly in light of the many instances throughout the book where the messy issues were explicitly put on hold until the final chapter, I had high expectations for the methodological discussion -- expectations that unfortunately were not met. I should be clear, however, that my disappointment with the concluding chapter does not alter my opinion that the book as a whole is an excellent treatment of the relationship between personal identity and ethics, and one that I would highly recommend to any professor looking for a textbook for a class addressing these issues.